Norms and Necessity

Norms And Necessity

Amie L. Thomasson, Norms and Necessity, Oxford University Press, 2020, 252pp., $82.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780190098193.

Reviewed by Marc A. Moffett, University of Texas, El Paso


In Norms and Necessity, Amie Thomasson (2020) sets out to develop a normative theory of our metaphysical modal vocabulary as an alternative to what she dubs the descriptivist mainstream. As she describes it, “Modal normativism [aims to] provide a way of understanding metaphysical modality in terms of deontic modality” (15). Specifically, her goal is to argue that metaphysical modal (hereafter, m-modal) vocabulary enables us to “make explicit, endorse, or renegotiate the rules of use of our terms (and what follows from them) in particularly useful ways” (64). I do not find her argument convincing for reasons I will try to articulate in this review. Despite this disagreement, however, there is much of value in the book, and it is an important contribution.

Thomasson’s central thesis—that m-modal vocabulary has as its primary function engagement with lexical rules—is in my view facially implausible. For, even granting that much of what speakers do with language is opaque, the general nature of our linguistic behaviors must be relatively transparent to us. After all, language subserves a communicative function and in order for it to achieve that function, speakers must be cognizant of their communicative actions. In the canonical cases, I choose my words because I take their meanings to accurately reflect what I believe and I generally believe that my audience will interpret those words (more or less) as I do. Similarly, competent speakers are generally aware of the pragmatic impact of their utterances and choose their utterances accordingly in context. In this sense, language use is deliberate. Given the deliberate nature of language, the thesis that our m-modal vocabulary primarily serves to engage lexical rules seems misguided. For, in making use of our m-modal vocabulary we do not typically take ourselves to be attempting to make explicit, or endorse, the lexical rules of the embedded terms. Consequently, if Thomasson’s thesis is correct, we have either been (a) engaging in a certain activity of which we were unaware or (b) using m-modal vocabulary eccentrically, or non-standardly, or even inappropriately. Both options strike me as implausible. One of the merits of Thomasson’s book is that she develops her normativist thesis in a way that at least deflects (though, I think, does not resolve) this sort of prima facie objection. Consequently, if we want to say what is wrong with it, we will have to dig deeper.

The closing chapters of Norms and Necessity are dedicated to articulating the advantages of modal normativism as Thomasson sees them (Ch. 6–8). The opening chapters provide the reader with a thoughtful development of the historical context of non-descriptivist theories of metaphysical modality and outline (but do nothing more than outline) the perceived difficulties with “heavy-duty modal realism” (Introduction and Ch. 1).  But the innovative center of Thomasson’s book (occurring in Ch. 2–5) is largely defensive and hinges essentially on the success of her work in Chapters 2 and 3 on the function and meaning of modal discourse. Specifically, the goal in these sections is to show that modal normativism is not subject to the sorts of objections that caused philosophers to abandon previous non-descriptivist theories of modality. Summing up the dilemma such views face, Thomasson writes:

Treat [modal] discourse as made true by our linguistic conventions or stipulations and you run into the classic problems of conventionalism. Deny that it is descriptive talk that needs truthmakers at all, and hold that it serves a different function, and you risk running aground on the Frege-Geach problem, since the same function is not served in embedded contexts.” (40; emphasis in the original)

Thomasson wisely eschews the first horn of dilemma and opts instead to tackle the Frege-Geach problem. Her strategy, in effect, is to detach the (as she sees it) normative function of m-modal language from its truth-theoretic meaning—or to, at least, severely attenuate the connection between the two. There are difficulties on both sides of this fission. On the truth-theoretic side, Thomasson cannot merely take on board standard descriptivist treatments of modality without thereby wandering back into “heavy-duty metaphysics”—avoidance of which is a primary motivation for reviving non-descriptivism in the first place. To avoid this outcome, Thomasson suggests adopting a pleonastic approach to ontology familiar from her previous work (see Thomasson 2015; also Schiffer 2003) and a deflationary theory of truth. I will return to these issues later, but first I will focus on the functional side of the fission.

According to Thomasson, philosophers of language and metaphysicians have been hamstrung in their theorizing about m-modality because they tacitly make the assumption that

modal discourse [i.e., indicative statements involving m-modal vocabulary] serves the function of describing either some feature of our world, or features of (other) possible worlds. [Which is often] just one instance of a functional monist assumption: the assumption that all discourse serves a descriptivist function. (52)

What is the descriptivist assumption? It is the assumption that

“[many] of the basic terms of our language serve the function of tracking certain features of the environment, with which they are meant to co-vary, enabling us to get around better. (8)

Stated thus, I can think of very few philosophers working today who would accept the descriptivist assumption that Thomasson claims is nearly universal.  I don’t wish to quibble with her characterization of descriptivism, however; we all get an intuitive sense of the class of semantic theories at which she is taking aim. But it is a non-trivial flaw of her work that her argumentation frequently advances by skating over details that philosophers have thought it important to uncover.

“Descriptivism” and the data Thomasson invokes to debunk it are a central case in point. According to Thomasson, we frequently use indicative statements to convey normative information. I can, for instance, convey the same normative information about the rules of Scrabble by uttering (in the appropriate context) either of the following sentences (Thomasson, 60):

  1. [Imperative] Complete your turn by counting and announcing the score for that turn
  2. [Indicative] Each player completes his/her turn by counting and announcing the score for that turn

These data are not in dispute: One and the same rule of Scrabble can be conveyed by both (1) and (2). But this observation itself cuts no ice.

The question is not whether (1) and (2) can be used to convey the same information. It is not even whether they are typically used to convey this information. The question is how they do this. It is a question of the linguistic mechanism, not ultimate outcome. There are two possibilities: Either (1) and (2) have the same semantics or they do not. I take it that the synonymy of the sentences is a non-starter and this is in any case clearly rejected by Thomasson herself. So the sense in which the two sentences convey the same information must be extra-semantic (or pragmatic) in nature.

Exactly the same point can be made with respect to Thomasson’s take on m-modal statements. The same regulative content of the meta-language utterance in (3) below can be conveyed by an object-language utterance involving m-modal vocabulary via “semantic descent”:

  1. The term “water” and the term “H2O” should always be co-referential.
  2. Necessarily, water is H2O.

In order to avoid the traditional problems with conventionalism, Thomasson rejects the claim that (4) is synonymous with (3). Thus, the sense in which the two sentences convey the same information must also be extra-semantic (or pragmatic) in nature.

Once this is conceded, however, modal normativism—understood as a thesis about the function of our m-modal vocabulary rather than a thesis about its truth-theoretic semantics—does not seem to substantively help us to avoid engaging in “heavy-duty metaphysics”. For heavy-duty metaphysicians are concerned with m-modal vocabulary, not in virtue of its communicative function, but in virtue of its semantics. Of course, descriptivists will think that communicative function and semantics are more closely aligned than Thomasson does. But descriptivism is an inessential add-on to the semantic theses that underlie heavy-duty metaphysics. As far as I can tell, they can happily take on board almost all of what Thomasson says about the function of m-modal discourse and this will not substantively affect the rationale for their metaphysical or semantic theses.[1]

But even if they could do this, I do not think they should for reasons indicated in the opening: our use of m-modal vocabulary does not seem to regularly function in the way Thomasson suggests. One way of seeing this is by considering cases of what appear to be shared m-modal content across linguistic communities. Consider a (possibly, monolingual) speaker of Spanish, Jafet, who utters “Necesariamente, el calor es energía cinética molecular media”).[2] According to Thomasson’s theory, the primary function of this utterance is to convey certain normative meta-linguistic information about the Spanish terms “el calor” and “energía cinética molecular media”. Indeed, given Thomasson’s rule for m-necessity introduction, this claim is acceptable only if the embedded clause (“el calor es energía cinética molecular media”) is “an object-language expression of an actual semantic rule” (82). Thus, the embedded clause itself must be understood as having as its primary function to convey that same meta-linguistic information; introduction of the m-modal terminology serving to simply disambiguate the regulative and purely descriptive uses of the sentence type “el calor es energía cinética molecular media” (81).

But now consider a (possibly, monolingual) speaker of English, Haydee, who utters “Heat is not necessarily mean molecular kinetic energy”. As we will see below, there is on Thomasson’s view a minimal semantic sense in which the two speakers may exhibit a genuine disagreement with one another in so speaking.[3] But given her thesis about the primary functions of their utterances, the substantive communicative import of the two utterances does not conflict. The primary function of Jafet’s statement is, after all, to convey regulative meta-linguistic information about Spanish terms; and the primary function of Haydee’s statement, information about English terms. But this conclusion is at odds with our sense that the two speakers not only express conflicting views, but also that this is what is primarily or focally at issue between them. Notice, moreover, that the disagreement between these speakers would be fundamentally different from the otherwise seemingly identical dispute expressed interlinguisitically. This point generalizes. On Thomasson’s view, cross-linguistically expressed m-modal contradictions will always be merely object-language expressions of non-contradictory meta-linguistic claims about the respective languages. The significance of m-modal metaphysical disputes is, in this sense, language-indexed and, consequently, the move to functional pluralism does not keep the view from being linguistically relativized. For many, this will be a bridge too far.

Up to this point I have argued (a) that adopting modal normativism as articulated by Thomasson does not in itself avoid a commitment to heavy-duty metaphysics and (b) that the function of m-modal vocabulary is not generally the meta-linguistic regulative one Thomasson claims. Let me circle back to the first point. If it is true that Thomasson’s modal normativism does not on its own undercut heavy-duty metaphysics, we are left with two questions: (1) Why does Thomasson bother with the functionalist thesis? And (2) how does Thomasson’s view provide an alternative to heavy-duty metaphysics?

I take it that the answer to these questions is interrelated. Thomasson believes that it is possible to give deflationary readings of most m-modal claims. For instance, Thomasson accepts that there may be m-modal properties and propositions, so long as these entities are understood as pleonastic entities. Doing so allows Thomasson a clever way of handling the Frege-Geach problem, particularly when combined with a deflationary meta-ontology. She writes:

So a speaker makes no mistake if she thinks of her modal utterance as describing the way the world is, in the sense of expressing an indicative truth, the literal semantic content of which is about the world [. . . .] The modal normativist accepts that modal claims are world-oriented in their literal semantic content [. . . .] One way to put the point [. . .] is to allow that an utterance of a metaphysical modal claim may make a (minimal) statement understood as an utterance we can sensibly say is (minimally) true [. . . .] But on the normativist view it would be a philosophical mistake to think of such utterances as serving to track modal features of the world, which they must mirror to be true, and which serve to assess and explain the truth of the modal claim. (70)

Call the metaphysics that results from application of Thomasson’s deflationary meta-ontolgy, pleonastic metaphysics. 

One concern about a full-blown adoption of pleonastic metaphysics is that it threatens to trivialize modal metaphysics tout court. Some philosophers will, of course, applaud this outcome. But Thomasson, I think, correctly recognizes that too much important work has arisen from the last half-century or so of heavy-duty metaphysics for this uncompromising form of pleonastic metaphysics to be plausible. Functional pluralism provides a way out of this bind: Pleonastic metaphysics resolves the Frege-Geach problem, while modal normativism resolves the trivialization concern by providing deontic reinterpretations of m-modal discourse that capture important developments in modal metaphysics (e.g., a posteriori necessities). Of course, if I am correct that we should reject modal normativism, the resolution fails. But it must be admitted that it is an elegant attempt.

In closing, however, I want to put some pressure on the feasibility of pleonastic metaphysics itself, specifically as it intersects Thomasson’s modal normativism and its motivations. As discussed above, I have doubts about the adequacy of modal normativism as an account of how m-modal language functions because it seems ill-equipped to handle interlinguistic (dis)agreement expressed in the m-modal vocabulary of different languages. Readers familiar with Alonzo Church’s (1950, also Langford’s 1937) criticisms of Carnap’s (1947) treatment of attitude reports will recognize the concern here as a generalization of those discussions.[4]

One way of seeing that the concern is more than mere analogy is to note that verbs of communication generate intensional contexts and must respect the Langford-Church Translation Test. Moreover, this will be so whether the communicated content is the literal semantic content of a statement or some extra-linguistic content the statement functions to convey. Given this, let us consider again our Spanish speaker, Jafet. Jafet utters “Necesariamente, el calor es energía cinética molecular media”. On Thomasson’s view, this statement has a primary function of conveying a metalinguistic principle, which we can report as follows:

  1. Jafet communicated that if the application conditions for “el calor” are met in a given situation then the application conditions for “energía cinética molecular media” must be met, as well

Haydee disagrees: “Heat is not necessarily mean molecular kinetic energy,” she says in her preferred language, English. On Thomasson’s view, we can report the primary information conveyed by Haydee as:

  1. Haydee communicated that if the application conditions for “heat” are met in a given situation then the application conditions for “mean molecular kinetic energy” must be met, as well.

But if this is so, then Haydee has not, in fact, disagreed with Jafet since (1) and (2) are wholly consistent with one another. [5][6]

To avoid this, Thomasson must retreat to a more abstract level at which the normative disagreement occurs, one which is neutral between the natural languages speakers actually utilize. One such candidate is, of course, something like the language of thought (or, more generically, concepts in the psychological sense). But this suggestion runs into two problems: (1) it requires that the language of thought be sufficiently conventional (in the way natural languages are) that a negotiation of the application conditions of its terms makes sense; (2) it entails that every sentient being with whom we could engage in a debate about metaphysical modality shares with us a common or universal language of thought. I take it that neither of these claims is in any way obvious. Moreover, it is at least plausible that any sense in which (2) will be true will involve us in characterizing this universal language of thought at such a level of abstraction that it is unclear what advance we will have made over a “heavy-duty metaphysics” that simply takes properties, relations, and propositions as abstracta and dispenses with these essentialist hypotheses about the nature of all possible thinkers!

So, I am not convinced that Thomasson’s view can be saved from the same family of concerns that ultimately defeated conventionalism. But this is, of course, no reason not to take the book seriously. It is smart, well-reasoned, and there is much that advances the current debate.


Carnap, R. 1947. Meaning and Necessity: A Study in Semantics and Modal Logic. Chicago, IL: University of Chicago Press.

Church, A. 1950. On Carnap’s analysis of statements of assertion and belief. Analysis, 10, 97–99.

Langford, C. H. 1937. Review of The Significs of Pasigraphic Systems. A Contribution to the Psychology of the Mathematical thought Process by E. W. Beth. Journal of Symbolic Logic, 2, 53–54.

Schiffer, S. 2003. The Things We Mean. New York: Oxford University Press.

Thomasson, A. (2015). Ontology Made Easy. New York: Oxford University Press.

Thomasson, A. (2020). Norms and Necessity. New York: Oxford University Press.

[1] One exception is Thomasson’s proposed introduction and elimination rules for metaphysical necessity, which are restricted to the occurrence of statements in their “regulative” use. But Thomasson offers no compelling reason for this restriction. Rather, it occurs in the context of trying to defend modal normativism as being consistent with now well-established principles of modal logic.

[2] “Necessarily, heat is mean molecular kinetic energy”. In this setting, it is inessential that the subject be monolingual. Indeed, the argument can be run on a single bilingual subject.

[3] It isn’t obvious that they do, since the pleonastic metaphysics Thomasson adopts doesn’t obviously yield identical pleonastic propositions across languages. This is one of the reasons for thinking that the move to pleonastic metaphysics doesn’t help us escape from heavy-duty metaphysics.

[4] It is somewhat surprising to me that Thomasson fails to discuss this issue in either of her two most recent books.

[5] Thomasson could avoid this objection by claiming that such disputes involve a contradiction only when the speakers are using the statement embedded under the “necessity” operator in their non-regulative use. But in that case, the speakers must violate the introduction rules for the necessity operator.

[6] Clearly this problem cannot be solved by reporting what Haydee communicates as follows: that if the application conditions for “el calor” or any appropriate translation of it are met in a given situation then the application conditions for “energía cinética molecular media” or any appropriate translation of it must be met, as well.  For this sentence would still not contradict Jafet’s corresponding claim without further establishing that, for example, “heat” is an appropriate translation of “el calor”. Moreover, taking such statements generally to communicate (or to function to communicate) this much more nuanced claim seems implausible.