Norms and Practices

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James D. Wallace, Norms and Practices, Cornell UP, 2009, 140pp., $42.50 (hbk), ISBN 9780801447198.

Reviewed by Daniel Groll, Carleton College



In this slim, highly readable volume, James D. Wallace attempts to show that mainstream, philosophical ethics has misconstrued the relationship between ethical norms and the practices that embody and express them. Using richly detailed historical and contemporary examples — perhaps the book’s greatest strength — Wallace argues that the relationship between norms and practices is much tighter than philosophers have typically held. More specifically, Wallace maintains that practices — “activities guided by a shared body of practical knowledge — ­­­­­knowledge of how to pursue the activity” — do not simply embody and express norms, including ethical norms, but that they provide the authority for the norms themselves (11). In other words, as Wallace sometimes puts it, norms are not independent of the practices they govern “in their existence or their authority” (2). I discuss below what Wallace means by this.

The book contains five chapters: chapter 1 introduces Wallace’s central thesis that “ethical norms are social artifacts” and, more specifically, that “norms, including ethical norms, are fundamentally constituents of actual practices” (9, 55). Chapter 2 critically explores the work of Frederick L. Will1 on norms and his distinction between the “manifest” and “latent” content of norms. In chapter 3, Wallace argues that despite initial appearances, his view gives us ample resources to improve our own norms as well as to assess critically the norms of other societies. Chapter 4 is a discussion of what Wallace sees as three unsatisfactory models of practical reasoning and moral reasons: “rule formalism”, intuitionism, and “extreme particularism” (85, 92). Wallace proposes that Will’s distinction between the manifest and latent content of norms suggests a fourth model that avoids the pitfalls of the others. Finally, in chapter 5, Wallace discusses the relationship between justice and benevolence. He argues that it is possible to be just without being benevolent and vice versa and, more generally, that the demands of justice and benevolence can come into fundamental conflict.

Chapter 5, and to a slightly lesser extent chapter 4, can be read with profit apart from the first three chapters. Wallace’s central idea — that ethical norms are “social artifacts” — is articulated and developed in chapters 1 through 3 so that is where I will focus this review.

Wallace frames the issue as follows:

English-speaking philosophers, over the last few centuries and up to the present, have defended several important different views of ethics. Most of these views are alike, however, in conceiving of moral norms as independent from the actual practices that make up the lives of human individuals and their communities. Indeed, … there is nearly a consensus that these norms are independent from the contingencies and vicissitudes of historical practice. (2)

Leaving aside the issue of just whom Wallace has in mind (I say more about this below), we might wonder in what sense philosophers have held moral norms to be independent from the “contingencies and vicissitudes of historical practice.” Unfortunately, Wallace does not elaborate. Nevertheless it is certainly true that many philosophers — Mill and Kant immediately come to mind — think that what we might call ultimate moral principles are independent from actual practice in at least the following sense: ultimate moral principles are not authoritative simply in virtue of their actually being embodied in people’s practices. That is, the fact that a community’s practices do not embody adherence to the categorical imperative (CI), for example, does nothing to undermine the CI’s status as an (the) ultimate moral principle. Moreover, in communities where practices not only conform to, but are in accordance with, the CI, it is not authoritative simply in virtue of its being embodied, as it were, in people’s actions. Rather, it is the standard by which we assess the practice. In this sense, the CI (or whatever norms we take to govern the activity) is independent of the practice in question.

The opposite view of moral principles, and the view Wallace endorses, is that ethical norms are practice-dependent in the following sense: the principles that guide right action in particular situations, or how to live well in general, are “constituents of actual practices” (5). What Wallace seems to mean is that ethical norms have no authority apart from their actually being practiced and that it is their place in actual practices that lends them normative authority. In other words, the view Wallace wants to develop and defend, and which I will call the “social artifact thesis” (SAT), is that ethical norms are nothing more than social artifacts and, indeed, he calls such norms “psychosocial in character” — ethical norms are constituted by people’s dispositions, beliefs, and tendencies (3). Later, Wallace claims that "When [ethical norms] are conceived as social artifacts, it is apparent that the authority that they have derives from our recognition of their importance in our practices, the substance of our lives" (27, emphasis added). In other words, the norms embodied in practices, including ethical norms, are authoritative for us only insofar as they are part of practices that are important to us, and not, as might be thought, the other way around.

Why should we think this is true? In chapter 1, Wallace aims to convince us of the “social artifact” thesis by likening ethical norms to other kinds of norms that he maintains are obviously social artifacts in the relevant sense:

So conceived, ethical norms are the precipitate of the discoveries and inventions over time of countless human beings, just as medicine or music are the result of the contributions of many. (9)

[Ethical norms] belong to the same genus, then, as other sorts of norms, such as the standards of right and wrong, better and worse, and practice in such matters as treating wounds, conducting international diplomacy, growing grain and making bread. (10)

In all such cases, says Wallace, our “knowledge of such matters is based upon our experience; in that sense it is empirical” (9). However, the examples, along with the sense in which Wallace wants to maintain that ethical norms are items of empirical knowledge/investigation, are not enough to support the SAT.

First of all, it seems that every feature Wallace ascribes to ethical norms could just as naturally be ascribed to mathematical norms, which we might say are also the “precipitate of the discoveries and inventions over time of countless human beings.” Nonetheless, mathematical knowledge is not empirical knowledge in any interesting sense. Furthermore, the authority of mathematical norms is independent of whether they are instantiated in practice: mathematical norms still govern those that do math poorly (indeed, it is what makes it possible for us to say that they are doing it poorly). These features of “empirical knowledge”, then, are not sufficient to establish anything so strong as the SAT.

But what of the practices and norms Wallace does mention? Perhaps they provide better support for the SAT. Consider doctoring. Here, Wallace will say that the norms of doctoring are determined by how doctors actually practice; were doctors to work differently, the norms of doctoring would be different.

There’s a sense in which this is clearly true. We can say that the norms of 15th century medicine, when doctors routinely diagnosed an imbalance of humors, were very different from the norms of doctoring today. It easy to read Wallace as saying that something similar is true for ethical norms:

If ethical norms are social artifacts, then these norms have a history; they sometimes undergo a development. The norms are changeable, improvable. According to this view, ethical knowledge develops in a community in response to the problems its members and other have faced over time. This implies that communities, with different histories and circumstances, might have different ethical norms, different understandings of how properly to live with one another. (9)

All this is indisputable if heard as an anthropological or historical point: we can no doubt trace the changing conceptions of right/wrong, good/bad, moral/immoral across different societies at different times just as we can trace the changing norms of doctoring.

Nevertheless this weaker way of construing the norms of doctoring (or ethics) as “social artifacts” is perfectly consistent with thinking that there are genuine/proper norms, which are authoritative apart from their role as actually instantiated in practices and so, in that sense, practice-independent. For we surely want to say that today’s doctoring norms are better than 15th century norms, that they are closer to what we might call the true norms of healing. Perhaps more controversially, we also want to say that the ethical norms in 21st century America (whatever their faults) are better than the norms 200 or even 50 years ago.

Whatever one thinks of this example, the point is that the fact that “Ethical norms are subject to change, like any other social phenomena” (2); or that different communities have different ethical norms (9); or that “Ethical norms are the result of the experience of many people over a long time” (2); or that one comes to know the norms of one’s society by way of experience (9); all of this is consistent with the view that genuine ethical norms have normative authority apart from their status as practiced or acknowledged. If we want to read the claims above in such a way that they are inconsistent with that view (i.e., genuine ethical norms really result from people’s experience, and not just that people cotton onto ethical norms via experience), then Wallace’s discussion and examples do not do enough to show that.

Leaving this worry aside, Wallace is aware that there are other obstacles in the way of the SAT. Three objections to the view figure prominently in the rest of the book:

1) The specter of cultural relativism. The view that ethical norms are social artifacts, “implies that communities, with different histories and circumstances, might have different ethical norms, different understandings of how properly to live with one another” (9). Once again, this is meant to be read not simply as an (obviously true) sociological claim, but rather a claim about the legitimacy of the differing ethical norms embodied in different communities and cultures.

2) No resources for criticism of existing practices. "If all ethical norms are social artifacts that arise out of people’s actual lives and practice, the norms are deeply implicated in their present practice. So conceived, such norms would lack the kind of independence of actual practice that would enable deep searching criticism of the practices themselves" (10).

3) No resources for resolving disagreements about and between practices. Once again, if ethical norms have no authority apart from being part of practices we take to be important, then there is a concern that Wallace’s view will not have the resources to explain how resolution is possible when conflicts between practices arise or when people disagree about what a particular practice demands.

Wallace deals with the last objection in chapter 2, while the first and second objections are treated in detail in chapter 3. For reasons of space I will focus on Wallace’s response to the first objection since it sheds the most light on the SAT.

Wallace’s response to the idea that the SAT cannot accommodate “effective cross-cultural social criticism” depends on two ideas. The first, which Wallace takes from Walzer2, is that of “minimal morality”, which amounts to the thought that “there are certain moral precepts that are common to many communities”, or that “however different human communities may be from one another, we can expect that their institutions and practices will have certain similarities” (74). Wallace cites the usual candidates for shared norms — prohibitions against murder, deceit, and betrayal — and explains their status as universally-shared by way of their necessary role in fostering the mere possibility of communal living: “Community, language, and cooperative activity are features of every culture, and certain norms are absolutely necessary for such cultural artifacts” (74).

The second idea to which Wallace appeals in his response to the first objection is just that in addition to the shared stock of norms found in all communities in the form of minimal morality, there are additional shared norms that result from cross-pollination of norms. The upshot is that “the argument from cultural relativism that claims that communities are so different that intercultural criticism, discussion, and agreement are impossible overlooks, amongst other things, cultural, and historical facts”, which reveal the interconnected nature of different cultures’ norms (75).

Wallace’s strategy here is to appeal to a fact about a shared stock of norms without answering the question (particularly in the case of the norms that constitute minimal morality): In virtue of what are there these norms shared? All Wallace wants to show is that we need not appeal to practice-independent norms to respond to the specter of cultural relativism objection.

My concern is that Wallace’s response does, in fact, depend on something very much like practice-independent norms, and this for two reasons. First, even though appealing to the mere fact of shared norms that constitute minimal morality might be sufficient to respond to the objection at hand, this is not a satisfying philosophical stopping point since one naturally wants to know what the source, or ground, of these shared norms is. One cannot simply avoid this question, particularly in an argument against the necessity or existence of practice-independent norms. It may turn out, after all, that the most satisfactory explanation of why there is a stock of common norms depends on the thought that such norms are practice-independent.

Second, Wallace does in fact go some way to answering the question by appealing to norms that appear to be practice-independent: we learn that the norms of minimal morality are in place because of their role in promoting community, language and cooperative activity, the suggestion being that these are human goods that need to be and indeed should be fostered. The story of why any decent human community must subscribe to some basic norms could take many forms. Nevertheless something very much like universal norms, which are justified in terms of their role in fostering the human good, are already in the picture. These norms at least appear to be practice-independent in the sense articulated above — we justify and critically evaluate particular practices in terms of their embodiment of independently authoritative norms, which in turn are justified in terms of their role in promoting human good. In short, the concern is that Wallace’s appeal to minimal morality sneaks practice-independent norms in through the back door: the appeal to minimal morality depends on a conception of ethical norms that are implicated in every good practice (or at least, every good practice does not run afoul of them) and which serve as the standard by which to assess and criticize practices (either our own or another culture’s). If Wallace wants to maintain that the norms of minimal morality are not practice-independent norms, he does not explain why they are not.

This concern returns us to the issue of exactly what the SAT amounts to, particularly as a view that is meant to be at odds with the history of ethics. Part of the difficulty here is that Wallace’s philosophical targets never clearly come into view. Chapter 1 begins this way:

Two assumptions are deeply entrenched in Anglo-American philosophical ethics. The first assumption is that ethical norms have an origin, existence, and authority independent from actual historical social practice. The second assumption is that each individual could, in principle, gain knowledge of such norms independently of other individuals. (8)

Putting aside the temptation to think immediately of counter-examples3, one wants to ask, “Who subscribes to these assumptions?” if for no other reason than that the answer would provide greater specificity to what are broadly-articulated assumptions.

Unfortunately, such specificity never comes. This is not to say that particular philosophers are not discussed. They are: the philosophers that Wallace musters in support of his views (Dewey, Will, Walzer and, in chapter 5, Hume) receive extensive discussion and referencing. The same is not true of the philosophers that represent the dominant allegiances Wallace wants to subvert. Oftentimes, as on the first page of chapter 1, one is given no indication of the target. At other points, particular targets are mentioned (Kant, Mill, Aristotle, Peter Singer, John Finnis, Norman Daniels), but these thinkers’ views are never fleshed out in any detail, or to the extent that they are, the view Wallace ascribes to his target is almost never substantiated with textual references as is the case in his discussion and criticism of Aristotle’s conception of practical reasoning.

I do not mean to focus unduly on what is not, strictly speaking, a philosophical issue. Wallace’s lack of specificity in identifying and discussing his targets, however, makes figuring out the substance of his main thesis difficult since the opposing camp never comes clearly into view.4 Nonetheless, Wallace has written a book with an intriguing central thesis and a series of related discussions that richly engage with historical examples to make interesting, and oftentimes insightful, points. One hopes that these ideas, and in particular Wallace’s “social artifact” thesis, will receive further elaboration in his future work.5

1 Specifically, Will’s Beyond Deduction: Ampliative Aspects of Philosophical Reflection (Routledge, 1988) and Pragmatism and Realism (Rowman and Littlefield, 1997, edited by K. R. Westphal).

2 Walzer, M. Thick and Thin: Moral Argument at Home and Abroad. Notre Dame, IN: University of Notre Dame Press.

3 Wallace calls the first assumption the “Platonic” and the second the “Cartesian” assumption, and Aristotle, Hume and Kant all come in for discussion or mention, so presumably Anglo-American philosophy includes most of the history of philosophy.

4 This is especially regrettable given that at least one prominent philosopher, viz. Joseph Raz (in The Practice of Value [Oxford University Press, 1995]) has dealt with more or less exactly the issue that interests Wallace and developed a view that, at least in some respects, is not unlike Wallace’s.

5 Thanks to Angela Curran, Micah Lott and Emily Carroll for comments on an earlier version of this review.