Norms in a Wired World

Placeholder book cover

Steven Hetcher, Norms in a Wired World, Cambridge University Press, 2004, 432pp, $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 0521454360.

Reviewed by Stefan Sciaraffa, University of Arizona


Steven Hetcher begins Norms in a Wired World with the following observation:

Social order may be regulated from above by the law, but its foundation is built on norms and customs which combat social disarray, allowing people to make meaningful and productive uses of their time and resources. The law's ability to promote a just social order can never be fully understood without taking account of the concurrent influence of these informal social practices. (1)

One of Hetcher's main aims is to provide an account of these informal social practices, which he refers to as norms. To this end, Hetcher argues in the first part of his book that norms are best conceived as patterns of behavior instantiated in a group and distinguishes between three kinds of norms: sanction-driven, coordination, and epistemic norms. Hetcher employs this conception and tripartite typology of norms in analyses of the evidentiary rule of custom in tort law and the emerging norms of online privacy in parts two and three of his book, respectively. The book's main and most interesting contribution to the literature is largely implicit in these analyses. Hetcher's basic idea is that characteristic of each kind of norm in his tripartite typology is a particular set of virtues and vices that have implications for how best to regulate a domain containing such norms. Thus, the wise legislator should take into account the kinds of social norms, if any, relevant to a domain before regulating it.[1]

I have three main critical but friendly comments that aspire to refine and improve upon this promising approach to the study of the relationship between law and social norms. Before moving on to these comments, I should, given the book's title, say a few words about the book's discussion of the "wired world". Be forewarned that, despite its title, the "wired world" accounts only for the last sixty or so pages of Hetcher's 400+ page book. Moreover, the discussion is fairly straightforward and uncontroversial, perhaps bordering on the obvious.

Hetcher's basic idea in this discussion is that the interests of website providers and their clients are in partial conflict. Website providers have interests in being able to use and sell their clients' personal information freely. They also have interests in doing business with prospective clients. Clients have privacy interests in limiting website providers' use of their personal information and they have interests in doing business with the websites, which involves providing the websites with personal information. Hetcher observes that website providers and their clients are in a kind of iterated prisoner's dilemma. The website provider could cooperate by limiting its use of its clients' personal information. However, it has various financial incentives to sell and use its clients' information, thereby defecting rather than cooperating. Because this is an iterated game, the clients have some leverage to ensure cooperation through sanction. That is, they can sanction defecting website providers by refusing to do business with websites that defect. However, this leverage is limited by the fact that the clients cannot easily identify defecting websites. Hetcher asserts that this strategic relationship between website providers and their clients gives rise to the following sanction-driven norm: Websites present themselves to clients as more restrictive in their use of clients' personal information than they actually are. Hetcher's analysis seems to suggest that this is an area where the legislator should step in. However, he does not explicitly make this point, nor does he discuss generally whether and what kind of regulation might be useful. Given the book's overarching objective of helping to determine the proper regulatory relationship between law and social norms, this is a surprising omission.

My first serious criticism of Norms in a Wired World concerns a distracting and unnecessary detour in the first part of the book -- namely, the extended discussion and refutation of the rule-conception of norms. According to Hetcher, the core thesis of the rule-conception holds that norms are "linguistic or verbal entities capable of being called up as occurrent or spoken thought." (18) Hetcher marshals a number of objections to this thesis, none of which are very convincing to my mind. His deeper mistake, however, is his supposition that he must clear the rule-conception of norms out of the way to make way for his own pattern-conception.

Hart's observation that the term "rules" has two senses applies equally to the term "norms." [2] Sometimes the term "norm" refers to a pattern or regularity of behavior. For example, we could say that it is the norm of the Robinson family that they go out for lunch immediately after church on Sundays. In saying this, we mean that the Robinson family manifests a certain habit or pattern of behavior. By contrast, "norm" can also refer to a normatively binding requirement that guides an agent's behavior. In this sense, Kant observes the norm of truth-telling. That is, he acts in a particular way -- he tells the truth -- and he acts in that way out of recognition that the norm of truth-telling is morally binding.

Rule-theorists use the term "norm" in this latter action-guiding sense because it is more germane to their research objectives. For example, Joseph Raz, a prominent rule-theorist whom Hetcher surprisingly ignores, aspires to map the structure of agents' practical reason.[3] Raz thinks of norms as one of the elements of an agent's practical reason that guides the agent's behavior. For a norm to play this role, it must be something that the agent can readily call to mind. Hence, Raz accepts the core thesis of the rule-conception -- norms are linguistic or verbal entities simple enough to be called up in verbal or occurrent thought. By contrast, Hetcher's ultimate concern is with law's ability to promote a just social order. As noted above, emergent patterns of behavior can affect law's capacity to bring about such an order. Thus, Hetcher has reason to attend to norms understood as patterns or regularities of behavior rather than as rules. In sum, the rule-conception and the pattern-conception answer to different research objectives, specify different senses of the term "norm", and capture different features of the world. As such, these conceptions are not competing. Hence, Hetcher need not undermine or limit the rule-conception in order to defend his pattern-conception of norms.

My second criticism aims at Hetcher's particular specification of the pattern-conception. Hetcher holds that a norm is a "pattern of rationally governed behavior, instantiated in a group, maintained by acts of conformity." (30) Thus, Hetcher's pattern-conception contains three elements. First, he understands a norm as a pattern of behavior instantiated in a group. Hetcher's second element holds that norms are rationally governed patterns of behavior. By rationally governed, he means that the persons instantiating the pattern of behavior do so for reasons. Though these first two elements seem relatively straightforward and unobjectionable, the third requires some explication. Moreover, this element does not fit well with Hetcher's research objectives.

The third element holds that for a pattern of behavior to be a norm, it must be maintained by acts of conformity. An act is an act of conformity if it can be explained by reference to other members' conformity to a norm. For example, we might say that an agent drives on the right side of the road because she knows that everyone else in her community drives on that side of the road. In this case, the agent's driving on the right side of the road would be an act of conformity because we can explain it by reference to others' conformity to the norm. Given Hetcher's research objective of assessing the nature of the social practices that might affect law's capacity to bring about a just social order, it is not clear why he limits his conception of norms in this way. An emergent pattern of behavior instantiated in a group has a bearing on the law's ability to bring about a just social order irrespective of whether the individual acts that constitute the pattern are acts of conformity. Moreover, this unnecessary limitation of his conception of norms leads astray Hetcher's analysis of the major exception to the modern rule of custom in tort. A few words about the modern rule of custom help to see this point.

Most cases in tort law are governed by the negligence standard. Under this standard, the defendant is liable for an injury to another only if the injury resulted from her negligence. Negligence is a failure to meet a standard of reasonable care. A recurring question in the jurisprudence of tort law is the connection between social norms and the standard of reasonable care. In some contexts, courts have held that actions in conformity with a prevailing social norm meet, as a matter of law, the standard of reasonable care (the per se rule). In other contexts, courts have held that the fact that the defendant has followed the prevailing social norms is evidence for the jury to consider in determining whether the defendant has met the standard of reasonable care (the evidentiary rule). In yet other contexts, courts have held that the defendant's following of the prevailing social norms has no evidentiary value whatsoever (the no-evidence rule). The modern rule of custom rejects the per se rule in favor of the evidentiary rule save for one major exception -- cases of medical malpractice (and perhaps other cases of professional malpractice). A medical professional's conformity to or failure to follow the norms of the medical community constitutes per se reasonable care or negligence, respectively.

In his explanation of this exception to the modern rule of custom, Hetcher problematically characterizes the norms of the medical community as epistemic norms. An epistemic norm arises when the members of a group calculate that they are more likely to do better overall if they follow the norm rather than determining for themselves what to do. Thus, on Hetcher's account, medical practitioners follow the norms of the medical community because they conclude that they will do better by following the norms rather than calculating for themselves what to do. However, this characterization distorts the nature of the norm. Undoubtedly, to some extent medical professionals look to authoritative sources about how best to deliver care. However, they also reflect critically from an educated and informed standpoint about their activity. The norms of the medical community reflect the convergence of the more or less independent judgment of experts.

Generally speaking, we can place great confidence in the convergent independent judgment of experts, as one everyday example and Condorcet's theorem demonstrate. Consider the stratagem of taking one's broken-down car to a number of mechanics to determine what is wrong with it. We do this because we know that the convergent diagnosis of a number of mechanics is much more reliable than the diagnosis of a lone mechanic. Condorcet's jury theorem illustrates this same idea. A version of this theorem posits a group of persons, each of whom has the same probability, P, of being correct about some matter and is more likely to be correct than not. The theorem demonstrates that, given a number of assumptions, the probability, G, that a majority decision of such a group is correct is greater than the probability, P, that any individual within the group is. Moreover, as the group's size increases, G quickly approaches 100%.

These examples illustrate that we are justified in placing great confidence in the convergent judgment of a community of independent experts. Thus, we can see why the courts apply the per se rule in cases of medical malpractice. It is important to note, however, the importance of the independence of the decisions of each expert. As the independence of each decision decreases, so does our confidence in the correctness of the convergent decision. For example, our confidence in the convergent judgment of the four auto mechanics would greatly diminish were we to learn that three of the mechanics simply deferred to the judgment of the fourth.

Given the role that independent judgment plays in the norms of the medical community, these norms are not norms according to Hetcher's conception. Recall that for Hetcher, norms are maintained by acts of conformity, meaning that individuals conform to the norm because other individuals within the group conform. However, as we have seen, the norms of a community of experts are maintained by acts of independent judgment, not conformity. Lest his analysis remain blind to this kind of pattern of behavior, Hetcher should not limit his conception of norms to patterns of behavior maintained by acts of conformity. Moreover, he should add the norms of a community of independent experts to his typology of norms.

My third criticism concerns Hetcher's general analysis of the rule of custom in tort law. Hetcher employs his conception and tripartite typology of norms in a rational reconstruction of this area of law. Hetcher holds that to determine which rule should be followed, courts must (as they have at least implicitly in the past) first identify which of the three kinds of norms is at issue. Though this determination is a necessary step in deciding which rule should apply, it is only the first step. Hetcher enumerates a number of other relevant factors and generates a chart containing thirty-seven permutations of these factors and the evidentiary rule that matches with each permutation.

My criticism of Hetcher's rational reconstruction of this area of the law is twofold. First, his thirty-seven-permutation chart does not correspond well to the body of decisions in this area of law. The courts have resoundingly and consistently rejected the per se rule, save for the main exception discussed above. Despite this, Hetcher's rational reconstruction enumerates 19 (of 37 possible circumstances) in which the per se rule should apply. Second, a simple and powerful rationale for the modern rule is available to the court -- a rationale that Hetcher suggests himself yet implicitly rejects in his exception-laden analysis of this area of the law. Namely, when the per se rule applies, there is the possibility of the perpetuation of a pernicious coordination norm; hence, the rule should be rejected in nearly all cases.

A coordination norm results when most or all members of a group have a dominant interest to act in whatever way the rest of the group acts. Driving on a particular side of the road is a classic example. Generally speaking, we each have a dominant interest to drive on the same side of the road as everyone else, whether this be the right or left. When the per se rule applies, this same kind of incentive structure is in place. Each member of the relevant group has an incentive to conform to the norm of the group, whatever that norm may be, in order to shield herself from liability. This incentive can be a powerful motivation for compliance irrespective of how stupid or dangerous the prevailing norm might be. By rejecting the per se rule, courts have forestalled this potentially perverse incentive structure.

In response, Hetcher would note that sometimes a prevailing norm is reasonable rather than pernicious and argue that in such cases, it would be good to preserve the norm by applying the per se rule. He would add that his thirty-seven-permutation chart identifies those circumstances in which we can expect to find a reasonable rather than a pernicious norm. In those circumstances, the per se rule should apply. The main problem with Hetcher's idea is the complexity of his thirty-seven-permutation chart. Each of these permutations comprises a number of factors, including the kind of norm in play, whether the parties put at risk by the norm are third parties or persons following the norm, whether the persons following the norm and third parties at risk are close-knit, whether the persons following the norm are better placed than a judge or jury to determine whether the norm is reasonable, and the disposition of a Kaldor-Hicks analysis of whether those following the norm could afford to compensate those potentially harmed by it. Such complexity does not make for a very workable guide for the courts or potential litigants. To see this, just imagine what briefs to the court would look like if these factors were the elements of the rule of custom. A surer and more workable rule would leave it to the court to decide on the reasonableness of prevailing norms on a case-by-case basis in light of the content and context of the relevant norm. Because there is no reason to think that the judge is better equipped for this enquiry than the jury, the question of whether a given norm is reasonable should go to the jury, which, in effect is to reject the per se rule in favor of the evidentiary rule. This, of course, is the modern rule of custom (save for the clear exception in the case of the medical profession discussed above).

[1] Though most of Hetcher's book relates directly to this main point, his discussion ranges widely to include a historical overview of the general role of custom in law, an inconclusive analysis of the proper role of the jury in tort law, and an argument that the negligence standard does not guide jury deliberations.

[2] H.L.A. Hart, 1997, The Concept of Law, 2nd ed., New York: Oxford University Press, 9-10.

[3] See Joseph Raz, 1990, Practical Reason and Norms, Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press.