Norms in the Wild: How to Diagnose, Measure, and Change Social Norms

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Cristina Bicchieri, Norms in the Wild: How to Diagnose, Measure, and Change Social Norms, Oxford University Press, 2017, 239pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780190622053.

Reviewed by David Henderson, University of Nebraska at Lincoln


Cristina Bicchieri (2006) advanced a powerful and well-received account of norms. Her work reflects important ways in which philosophical and social scientific reflection on norms can be joined to great advantage. In its empirical richness, her work goes beyond the also important work of Philip Pettit (1990) and by Brennan, Eriksson, Goodin, and Southwood (2013). Bicchieri understands various kinds of norms as rules for which agents have a conditional preference to conform. Such preferences are keyed to various expectations -- empirical expectations and normative expectations.

Empirical expectations have to do with how people do and will behave in the relevant class of situations. For example, do folk in the relevant population or community expect the preponderance of folk to follow the rule of driving on the right-hand side of the road? Conditional on this expectation, they prefer to follow that rule. Do folk in the relevant community or group expect that folk share food in times of differential hunting/gathering success? Their preference for so doing may be dependent in part on such empirical expectations. Normative expectations have to do with how folk will judge that one ought to behave in the relevant class of situations -- and whether their evaluations might also issue in punishment of various kinds (including gossip and reputational damage). For example, do agents expect that folk in the relevant population or community largely judge that people do something wrong when not sharing food after having enjoyed significant hunting or gathering success? Do they expect that perceived failures to share will result in gossip, marginalization in subsequent exchanges, or other punishment? The preference for conforming to the sharing rule may be conditioned on such normative expectations.

It is a significant strength of Bicchieri's approach that it allows one to sort out how varied empirical and normative expectations within an interacting group or population can condition whether that group ends up coordinating or cooperating in following a given rule. This strength is on display in powerful and subtle ways in this latest book.

In The Grammar of Society, Bicchieri distinguished three classes of norms. Each has to do with different classes of social choice situations -- situations in which the costs or benefits of a given agent's actions turn on the actions of others. Social norms are understood as those rules that regulate and in important ways transform mixed-motive games -- choice situations in which there are goods to be gotten by joint conformity (cooperation payoffs), and goods to be gotten by not conforming (temptation payoffs). Economic games, such as the prisoner's dilemma and the public-goods game serve to model such choice situations. Rules for sharing of food can serve as an example of social norms. In these contexts, the preference to conform to the rule may turn on both the descriptive expectation that sufficient others conform, and the normative expectation for certain kinds of normative reactions and punishment on the part of others. These normative expectations overcome what temptations folk may have to defect from the social norm. Descriptive norms are understood as those rules that have to do with coordination games -- situations in which the goods are to be gotten merely by coordination on any one of several alternatives -- and in which there are no temptations to defect on a group coordination once it is salient. Driving on a settled side of the road is an example. In such cases, conformity may come with empirical expectations alone. Conventions are understood as a special class of descriptive norms. Such, in compressed outline, is Bicchieri's framework -- which is presented and in some ways refined in strikingly clear terms in the first chapter.

Both descriptive norms and social norms turn on conditional preferences -- individuals prefer to conform to the relevant rule, provided they have the associated expectations regarding others' conformity and attitudes. Not all patterns of similar practice within a group need be the result of norms of one of these kinds. Some patterns of similar practice within social groups may be a result of folk having the unconditioned preference to behave in some given way. Here there are two kinds of cases. First, the preference for behavior fitting to some moral sensibilities may be unconditioned -- so that folk conform to the sensibility whether they expect others to or not, and whether they expect wide agreement of not. Second, there are situations in which a pattern of behavior arises out of individual non-moral preferences. Here the choice situation confronted by individuals yields the preference and behavior in a way that is not dependent on their having expectations about others acting similarly. For example, in a group in which there is a tasty food available, individuals may each prefer to eat that food independently of expectations about others' actions or evaluations. In such cases, we have what Bicchieri (pp. 15-17) terms a custom rather than a norm. "A custom is a consequence of independently motivated actions that happen to be similar to each other" (p. 19).

Bicchieri recognizes that marginal cases are possible: "Here I shall offer a few static definitions. They are static because in real life, the social constructs I talk about may morph into each other and often do. A custom may become a social norm in time, and a social norm may revert to a custom" (p. 3). One could, I think, envision yet further cases in which, rather than morphing into one another across time, a practice in a group might conform to a rule that functions both as a custom and as a social norm. In such a case, the distributed practices in a group at one and the same time would be partially explained as customary and partially explicable as social norms. That is, there might be a pattern of similar practices within a group that is both the result in many cases of individual unconditioned preferences, and also in many other contemporary cases be the result of conditional preferences keyed to empirical and or evaluative expectations.

Henderson and Graham (forthcoming) consider the hygienic practice of regularly washing one's hands. For many situated agents, regular handwashing would seem to make at least a probabilistic difference to the likely health trajectories of that agent -- and this can make for an unconditioned preference for regular hand washing. Insofar as this makes for the common individual preference for regular handwashing, that practice is a custom. On the other hand, there are cases in which many agents' regular handwashing would likely make little difference to their own health (perhaps they are already sick, or have acquired resistance to the salient illnesses). Such agents (and others) may think of handwashing as contributing to a public good, by eliminating disease vectors within the community. To some extent, then, the preference of the individual agents for regular handwashing might well be conditional in ways characteristic of norms. Thus, the pattern of practice within the group may be partially accounted for each way -- and one might talk of how much of it is explicable in terms of unconditional preferences under situational framing and of how much is accounted for by conditional preferences under situational framing. Henderson and Graham suggest that epistemic norms can be understood in parallel ways.

In The Grammar of Society, Bicchieri discussed a variety of probative laboratory experiments which afforded significant support for her theory of norms. Now she pursues the application and development of her theory within the messier context of real social settings. This has come with Bicchieri's fruitful engagement with UNICEF and various NGOs, which has allowed her to study a diverse set of norms in the wild -- and to have a hand in interventions seeking to change some of those norms. The norms and practices studied include those associated with child marriage, female genital cutting, gendered violence within families, and harsh physical punishment of children. If we are to understand the dynamic of the relevant norms, we must come to understand how empirical and normative expectations are distributed in the relevant populations. We must also understand how these expectations themselves result from patterns of practice (including expressed approval and disapproval) within the relevant groups. If we are to intervene so as to change some norms -- think of child marriage -- we must change various expectations in a community -- expectations that are themselves conditioned by patterns of practice and evaluation within the relevant community. Commonly, it will not be sufficient merely to advertise the advantages of alternative practices, for commonly the considerations making for the conformity to extant norms include the social costs of defection. Thus, to intervene to change the norms of child marriage, one commonly must do more than advertise to families with young girls the advantages of deferred marriage in the service of education. We must somehow intervene to change the expected costs of defecting from the extant norm -- cost for them that are accounted in terms of the marriageability of, and the commonly lower dowry given for, older girls.

It is notable that the impact of normative expectations (and to some extent empirical expectations) may be a graded matter: one's practice may be deeply conditioned by one's expectations concerning some people, and less significantly by expectations regarding others in the population. This is a matter of the structure of people's "reference networks" (p. xiii). Bicchieri notes that the norm of not breastfeeding children from birth may be particularly strongly conditioned on the expected disapproval of mothers-in-laws in the traditional households. The practice of child marriage may be conditioned by the expected reactions of those who are in charge of the marriage decisions for others within the village. Fieldwork affording one a sense for the structure of people's reference networks may then afford one hypotheses about the character of the practice -- and about where effective interventions might be mounted. Changing the norms then requires changing the empirical and normative expectations to which agents' conditional preferences are most sensitive, which commonly requires interventions within the relevant reference network (pp. 52-60).

Other norms discussed include sanitation practices. Here Bicchieri discusses the construction and use of public latrines (in India, for example) where public defecation is customary in much of the countryside. The public health benefits to be gotten via latrines requires coordinated action (pp. 95-97, 113-117). It turns out that it is emphatically not the case that, "if you build it, they will come." Various empirical and normative expectations are crucial to getting people to pay the individual costs of sometimes inconvenient side-trips to gain the public health benefits -- thus what are called for are social norms where in the past there was largely just custom.

One should distinguish between folk in the relevant group having a normative expectation and there in fact being the expected normative consensus among the relevant group. Whether a social norm issues in a regular pattern of behavior depends on there being normative expectations (and empirical expectations) -- not on there actually being a normative consensus among the relevant group. The point can be significant when one seeks to effect a change in practice within a group that may hold to a hurtful norm. As long as folk expect others to respond with the relevant normative responses, folk will tend to conform to the norm, even once many individuals have come to think that the practice is not good. Of course, this regularity in practice and in expressed disapproval can reinforce the normative expectations. This can make for an understandable ignorance of what may have been a shift in normative consensus. Bicchieri (pp. 42-47) discusses the phenomena -- dubbed "pluralistic ignorance." A practice may issue from a social norm -- backed by the associated empirical and normative expectations -- while the individual normative sentiments of folk in the relevant group are not generally approving of the practice.

Clearly, understanding the character and kind of norms found in a group can thus turn on relatively subtle measurements of expectations and preferences -- and such measurement is the focus of the second chapter. Such measurement is necessary to ascertain the ways in which that practice is conditioned by such expectations. In the laboratory, it is possible to manipulate agents' expectations in various ways -- one might provide information about the play of agents in past trials, for example, or one might have the subjects play against a stooge over several trials. In such ways, one provides one's subjects with apparent information that resets their expectations -- their changing choices then reflect how the practice is conditioned on expectations. However, in the field, one cannot readily manipulate the possible conditioning expectations. In significant measure, one must rely on various instruments from the standard toolbox of the social sciences -- notably questionnaires. Bicchieri provides a rich discussion of the possibilities here, one grounded in her thoughtful engagement with work in the field. It is worth saying that this discussion does not merely elucidate the social scientific epistemology of norms -- it also furthers our reflective understanding of the diversity of the norms about which we seek to garner evidence.

As reflected above, Bicchieri is not engaged with these matters simply as a social theorist and as philosopher and epistemologist of the social sciences. Rather, there is a significant normative and practical character to her engagement. She devotes chapters to both the dynamic of norm change and to the levers or tools that can be used by those seeking to foster different norms that better the life prospects of people and lead to the provision of important public goods.

This is a fascinating and informative read -- one rich in its appreciation for complexities and grounded in concrete engagement with such complexities.


Bicchieri, C. (2006). The Grammar of Society: The Nature and Dynamics of Social Norms. Cambridge University Press.

Brennan, G., Eriksson, L., Goodin, R., and Southwood, N. (2013). Explaining Norms (1st edition.). Oxford University Press.

Henderson, D., and Graham, P. (forthcoming). A Refined Account of the "Epistemic Game": Epistemic Norms, Temptations and Epistemic Cooperation. American Philosophical Quarterly.

Pettit, P. (1990). Virtus Normatia: Rational Choice Perspectives. Ethics, 100, 725-755.