Not Half No End: Militantly Melancholic Essays in Memory of Jacques Derrida

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Geoffrey Bennington, Not Half No End: Militantly Melancholic Essays in Memory of Jacques Derrida, Edinburgh University Press, 2010, 169pp., $32.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780748643165.

Reviewed by Kas Saghafi, University of Memphis


Geoffrey Bennington's Not Half No End, a volume of essays all written, with the exception of one, after Jacques Derrida's death in October 2004, is "profoundly marked" by this death and attempts "to go on thinking in its wake" (xi). Despite the difficulty, indeed the impossibility, of being able to go on, the chapters of this very fine book display with dexterity, finesse, and expertise why Bennington has been recognized as one of the foremost interpreters and expositors of Derrida's thought.

As the introduction tells us, the first half of the title of the book -- preferably to be pronounced with a glottal stop as "Noʔ'alf!" (think of The Two Ronnies, for those who might be familiar with Ronnie Barker's accent on the British show of the 1980s) -- exploits the ambiguity of the British English colloquial expression which functions as an intensifier, to stress that, in one of its senses, one is really in mourning -- not half! (xiii). In fact, the two parts of the book's title -- "Not Half" and "No End" -- both allude to melancholia or demi-deuil, half-mourning, a notion invoked by Derrida in the mid-1970s . This demi-deuil would not be Freud's pathological melancholia, but a structurally endless state, "the only possible mourning" (xii). As is well known, for Freud, mourning has a limited duration and successfully deals with loss and grief while melancholia is a deficient or incomplete way of dealing with it. To recover from loss, mourning has to be gotten over.

This might explain calls from certain quarters -- unhappy with all the alleged "pathos" associated with what has been written since Derrida's passing away and bored with the "tedium" of text after text by Derrida scholars, astute readers, interpreters, friends, and admirers trying to cope with the loss of a thinker who will turn out to have beenone of the greatest of the twentieth century -- to bring it all to an end, to be done with mourning. Let's be done with the "suffocating trend toward mourning . . . close-circuit canonization" and move on to more important matters, they say. Let's get over mourning. What these naïve and hasty calls seem to mistake is to take mourning for a simple affect and forget that it is structurally always unfinished and incomplete. What these calls conceal is the abiding hostility harbored by many in the academic world toward Derrida and what he stood for. What they also reveal is the strange, secret desire to be included, to be part of a group of "insiders" who would be seen as legitimately eulogizing him.

Bennington's book, unapologetic and militant -- militant in the manner of Derrida in Specters of Marx -- in its admiration and esteem for Derrida's work, would serve as, if I could say this, an antidote to these calls, explaining over a number of lucid, inventive, and trenchant essays why mourning is not something that can be gotten over. The only possible response seems to be an "originary melancholia," which Bennington details in several chapters, for example in "Half-Life."

In the chapter entitled "In the Event," Bennington analyzes the flurry of activity provoked by the death of cultural figures such as Derrida that seeks to "order, assess, classify and thereby, I'd be tempted to say, to forget and to neutralize" (36). Derrida's thought, he argues, puts into question the very "discursive machinery" that processes and records these and every other event, thus writing them off. Bennington goes on to discuss what he calls the philosophical concept of biography, explaining why any philosopher's life, but especially Derrida's, will inevitably receive the same treatment reserved for the event.

In the chapter entitled "Jacques Derrida: . . . A Life," Bennington presents Derrida's ultra-transcendental concept of life, a thinking of life as "an economy of death," where life itself is this life-death or originary survival/living on (9). Pursuing in detail the arguments regarding the brevity of life in Seneca's De Brevitate Vitae, Bennington explores philosophy's and philosophers' relation to death. Following a reference to Seneca by Diderot in Derrida's Aporias, Bennington patiently unfolds Seneca's recommendations for making the best of one's life. Living, truly living, it turns out, is "not allowing others to take one's time away," and by analogy thus jealously guarding one's money or wealth. For Seneca, who venerates the certainty of the past, the present is to be used to live in the past. This, Bennington observes, would be tantamount to a life that has no future, "a kind of living death" (16). If the philosopher is, as it is claimed, the one who knows how to die, then keeping the company of other philosophers is tantamount to being taught about and preparing for death. Thus a life is philosophical insofar as it is oriented toward death (9). However, Bennington claims, if "philosophy needs philosophers, and it needs them to live and die philosophically," then Jacques Derrida, as one who in his last published interview admitted to never having "learned-(how)-to-live" and thus to die was not simply a philosopher (9).

If, as Bennington demonstrates, Derrida does not share the same theoretical assumption that makes any philosopher worth his or her salt a philosopher, in other words, knowing how to live by learning how to die, Derrida also stands for -- and perhaps this partly accounts for the icy reception that he received from philosophers -- something that philosophy is unable to deal with. Philosophy, Bennington writes in "Beginnings and Ends," cannot fully account for the challenge of deconstruction as a "practice" ofreading, which unsettles the opposition between the active and contemplative life. Explaining Derrida's deconstruction of "the archeo-teleological" structure that makes up metaphysics, Bennington suggests that the "question" or "situation" of reading, which he has previously explored in other texts such as Other Analyses and Dudding, not only does not belong to any particular discipline but challenges the very concept of discipline (138). The notion of reading, drawing inspiration from Derrida's very early writings, is raised in the chapter called "Write, He Wrote." Since reading is structurally endless and "opens texts up beyond their historical specificity" (110), Bennington claims, it will be "something that will always remain unacceptable to philosophy as such" (128). The "inaugural thinking of reading" whose taking place is based on my "non-comprehension" (126) is something that philosophy could not allow or abide by. "The opening (of reading) remains a priori open, and thus will remain open forever," a fact intolerable to the philosophical profession, for which reading is merely a limited, contextualized, historical endeavor or activity. Bennington asserts: "let's just come out and say it, the philosopher as such, the professional philosopher does not read" (127).

I can only isolate, in a brutal fashion, and highlight a few of what I believe to be the most important contributions of Bennington's book toward a more enriched appreciation of Derrida's work. The following are just a few of the motifs that he revisits throughout the book: (1) Infinite différance is finite, (2) At the origin there is complexity, (3) What Bennington calls autro, and (4) The end of the world [la fin du monde].

More than one essay in this text refers to Derrida's notoriously difficult statement that appears in Voice and Phenomenon: "Infinite différance is finite." In the chapter titled "Handshake," Bennington explores Derrida and Nancy's relationship through a reading of Le Toucher. In an intricate reading, attentive to the minute details involved, Bennington brilliantly traces Nancy's three published references to the above-mentioned statement, analyzes Nancy's initial misreading, explication, and response to it in terms of a subtle non-reciprocity between the two thinkers and explains why Nancy is mistaken to place his emphasis on the always radically finite trace as infinite.

In "Foundations," Bennington writes about his desire or temptation after Derrida's passing away to search for the starting point or origin of his thought. Before embarking upon this search he is of course aware that there is no such thing as an origin for Derrida, or more accurately, as he explains, that there is complexity at the origin (19). A simple origin, which metaphysics believes is the source of subsequent complexity and would merely be a form of presence, is only retro-jected as an origin. In contrast, Derrida's is a thinking of a (non-) originary trace as "the origin of the origin" (21). Bennington notes that while describing language as an instituted trace in Of Grammatology, Derrida has recourse to the concept of institution. This leads Bennington to reflect on the nature of institutions and deconstruction's relation to institutions -- why there will never be an "organized institution of deconstruction whatsoever, no department or school or institute, no institution of deconstruction" -- and to discuss the violent nature of the founding gesture or institution of institutions (similar to the foundation of the state) (31).

In "Auto-," which consists of aphoristic meditations on the prefix "auto-," Bennington coins a new term autro, playfully combining "auto" and the French word for other, autre: "The other auto: the autro." (5). (In a later chapter in the book, Bennington refers as "autronomy" to the law that, by affecting it from the very beginning with the other, lets an "auto-" effect appear (133)). Derrida's early work showed that all auto-affection involves hetero-affection. In Benninton's words: "I affect myself -- always with the other." Devoting a section of the chapter to a gloss on a puzzling sentence from Politics of Friendship, "Democracy is the autos of deconstructive auto-delimitation," Bennington explains that the auto-deconstructive force of democracy does not merely deconstruct itself but also deconstructs the auto-. Further, the auto- never deconstructs itself all by itself, but it is the other that deconstructs and is deconstructed.

"The end of the world" appears as the second part of the title Derrida used for the French edition of The Work of Mourning.[1] There, in a number of pieces written after the death of his friends and fellow colleagues, Derrida wrote of the death of the other as the end of the world, not the end of a world, nor the end of my world, but of the world. Death, he wrote in another text called Rams quoted by Bennington, would be the absolute end of "what each opens as a one and only world, the end of the unique world, the end of the totality of what is or can present itself as the origin of the world for such and such a unique living being, human or not" (Béliers 22-3). Bennington treats this perplexing notion in the "Introduction," "Jacques Derrida: . . . A Life," "In the Event," and elsewhere.

I would add an addendum to Bennington's rich discussion. The only detailed treatment of the relation between world and its end in Derrida's work that I know of takes place in his response to Jean-Philippe Millet, entitled "Fidélités à plus d'un," at a conference in Rabat, Morocco in April, 1996.[2] In response to Millet's paper which is part of a panel that poses questions to Derrida and which partly discusses Fontenelle's notion of the plurality of worlds, Derrida says that each major philosophical notion of "world" from Leibniz to Husserl and Heidegger "supposes a horizon of pre-comprehension, a presumption of unity, a presupposition of coherence, of belonging, the logosor legein of a gathering, a horizon from which or upon whose ground all that happens happens as such" (245). What he suggests instead of these prevailing notions is an "im-possible world," whose im-possibility is not negative. I "share" the "unity without unity" of the world, he says, with whomever [quiconque], with every arrivant. Using the Husserlian language of Ideas and late essay "The Earth Does Not Move" invoked by Millet's paper, Derrida further explains, I know that my "here-now" is absolutely untranslatable and the world in which I speak is absolutely heterogeneous, having nothing in common with the world of each one [chacun]. There is an infinite distance between their "here" and mine. "There is an infinity of untranslatable worlds and this untranslatability is the condition of the arrival of one for the other" (247). Each "here" is a world and the opening of a world and "each death the end of the world" and death signals a world that disappears. "And if each death is the end of the world, there are an infinity of worlds" (248).

It is impossible to adequately treat all the compelling chapters in Not Half No End, ranging from "Foundations," in which Bennington argues that if the University has any responsibility, it is to foster events of thought, to "The Limits of My Language," Bennington's treatment of the mistaken reading of Derrida as proposing a philosophy of language or an ultra-linguisticism for which there is really no world and all is language. All that I can do is, by taking advantage of the British English idiomatic expression, to say that this book is not half bad.

[1] Jacques Derrida, Chaque fois unique, la fin du monde (Paris: Galilée, 2003)

[2] Jacques Derrida, "Fidélités à plus d'un" in "Idiomes, nationalités, déconstructions: Rencontre de Rabat avec Jacques Derrida" Cahiers INTERSIGNES 13 (Autumn 1998): 221-65.