Not Passion's Slave: Emotions and Choice

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Solomon, Robert, Not Passion's Slave: Emotions and Choice, Oxford University Press, 2003, 280pp, $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 0195145496.

Reviewed by Matthew Ratcliffe, University of Durham and ,


This collection of twelve essays charts the development of Robert Solomon’s theory of emotion, from ‘Emotions and Choice’ (1973) to ‘On the Passivity of the Passions’ (2001). As Solomon acknowledges in the Preface, several aspects of his thought, such as an early hostility towards neurology and physiology, have undergone considerable revision during this period. However, the claim that our emotions are ways of experiencing the world for which we can (at least sometimes) be held responsible is retained throughout and constitutes the core of his evolving position.

Solomon’s early view can be drawn from the first three essays, ‘Emotions and Choice’, ‘On Physiology and Feelings’ (an extract from The Passions, 1976) and ‘The Rationality of Emotions’ (1977). In these pieces, Solomon argues against the ‘traditional view’ that emotions are mere affects or feelings. Though conceding that emotions are ordinarily accompanied by feelings, he claims that these feelings are not an essential part of the emotion. In his strongest statement of this point, Solomon suggests that “the feelings no more constitute or define the emotion than an army of fleas constitutes a homeless dog” (p. 30). This dismissal of bodily feelings motivates Solomon’s distaste towards neurological and physiological approaches to the emotions, which tend to emphasise affect.

In contrast to affect theories, Solomon argues that emotions are rational and purposive, more like actions than occurrences that happen to us (p.3). This view is supported by the observation that one’s emotions are closely tied to one’s appraisal of a situation. For example, if X falsely believes that Y has been slandering her, X will become angry with Y, but only until she realises that her beliefs concerning Y were mistaken. Following this realisation, the feelings associated with the emotion may persist but the emotion itself will disappear, suggesting both that the emotion is influenced or constituted by one’s reasoned assessment of a situation and that it is not to be identified with an associated affect (p.5). Solomon employs such examples to suggest that emotions are not feelings but judgments. As such, they are stances towards the world for which we can be held responsible. Characteristically emotional judgments are singled out by their normative and often moral nature and by their concern with self-esteem. They also tend to be urgent judgments, and Solomon suggests that the irrationality commonly ascribed to emotions is symptomatic of the situations to which they respond. Emotions are, we are told, urgent responses to desperate situations (p.12). So they may appear irrational or unthinking, even though they are actually purposive and often strategic.

The fourth and fifth essays, ‘Nothing to be Proud of’ (1980) and ‘Emotions’ Mysterious Objects’ (1984), make clear that Solomon is offering a phenomenological theory of emotion. That emotions are judgments might seem translatable into the claim that they are Intentional states. However, Solomon stresses that an emotion is not an internal, psychological state that reaches out to hook up with an external and distinct Intentional object. Instead, turning to phenomenology, he claims that emotions are structures through which the world is experienced. They do not connect with but, rather, constitute their objects. An object of emotion is the object that it is because it is experienced through the emotion: “An emotion, as a system of judgments, is not merely a set of beliefs about the world, but rather an active way of structuring our experience, a way of experiencing something” (p.54). Hence emotions cannot be analysed apart from their objects and any construal of Intentionality as a subjective state plus a distinct object to which that state is directed will mis-describe the structure of emotional experience. Emotions, Solomon claims, are phenomenologically unitary phenomena that cannot be adequately analysed in terms of subject/object, internal/external or any other dualistic distinction. In discussing Davidson’s account, Solomon is especially critical of propositional-attitude theories of emotion. An emotion is certainly not an attitude towards a proposition; it is a web of constitutive judgments through which things appear in a certain way.

The sixth essay, ‘Getting Angry’ (1984), discusses the cultural dimensions of emotion. Solomon criticises anthropological applications of Jamesian theories for assuming a clear distinction between a culture-independent physiological component of emotion and its diverse cultural interpretations. Again resisting the idea that emotions can be broken down into parts, Solomon suggests that cultural interpretation of an emotion is partly constitutive of what that emotion is: “An emotion is a system of concepts, beliefs, attitudes, and desires, virtually all of which are context-bound, historically developed, and culture-specific” (p.87). The structure of one’s judgments is bound up with cultural interpretation and, because emotions are systems of judgments, they will be cultural through and through. So the idea of a physiological core and a cultural overlay of interpretation gives way to a more holistic construal.

As the ninth essay, ‘The Politics of Emotion’ (1998), makes clear, the charge of neglecting culture can also be applied to Solomon’s own early views. Solomon acknowledges his tendency to regard emotions as ‘personal’ experiences, and, as a corrective, he stresses that social context is essential to the structure of emotional judgments. Emotions, Solomon suggests, are essentially ‘political’ and “many emotions are about power, persuasion, manipulation, and intimidation” (p.153). A pressing task is that of wedding the phenomenology of emotion to its social context.

This opens up the possibility of constructive dialogue with the social sciences and thus moves away from the hostility towards social science that is evident in The Passions. An increased openness to interdisciplinary perspectives is also evident in the eighth essay, ‘Back to Basics’ (1993, revised 2001), which addresses some central concerns of current biological thinking on the emotions. Solomon is critical of reductionist strategies, which attempt to break the emotions down into a set of biological atoms or basic emotions, and suggests that any list of basic emotions needs to be socially and historically situated. For example, ethical interests will motivate very different taxonomies from objective science, a point that can be illustrated by the contrast between Aristotle’s discussion of emotion and recent scientific accounts of affect programmes. Solomon suggests that many different taxonomies can inform different contexts of interest. Hence scientific taxonomies are not privileged over all others. Though critical of universal ‘basic emotions’, Solomon explicitly concedes the importance of current scientific research, even admitting that reductionism, though it needs to be constrained to its appropriate contexts, has made “enormous strides” (p.131).

The tenth essay, ‘Against Valence’ (2001), ventures a structurally similar argument to ‘Back to Basics’ in suggesting that current and historical divisions between ‘positive’ and ‘negative’ emotions are multifarious, with very different distinctions being of use in different contexts. In one context, a pleasure/pain dichotomy may be invoked, whilst in another, virtue/vice might take central place. The central claim of both essays is that emotions are complex and need to be approached from many different angles. Thus the urge to reduce them all to a uniquely accurate set of basic emotions, which can be crudely classified as ‘positive’ and ‘negative’, should be resisted.

In the final two essays, Solomon makes two substantial concessions to his critics, weakening his longstanding claims that we are responsible for our emotions and also acknowledging that the bodily aspects of emotion are important. In his earlier work, Solomon repeatedly refers disparagingly to mere affects, claiming that emotions are not merely feelings and that affect is not even a necessary feature of emotional experience. However, given his reliance on phenomenology, this hostility to the idea that body states have an important experiential role is peculiar. Solomon regularly appeals to the likes of Heidegger, Sartre and Merleau-Ponty, all of whom draw attention to the practical and/or embodied nature of world experience. Indeed, the experiential role of a bodily orientation is readily apparent to any amateur phenomenologist. The cup only appears graspable and the chair only appears comfortable when encountered through a sense of one’s bodily capacities. This simple acknowledgement is enough to indicate that the body plays a role in structuring at least some of one’s experiential judgments. And it is a short step from here to the claim that certain characteristic feelings of body states are indissociable from those systems of constitutive judgments that Solomon calls emotions.

In Essay 11, ‘Thoughts and Feelings’ (2001), Solomon concedes this point and admits that his early work is guilty of neglecting the body: “In my original theory, it was by no means clear that the body had any essential role in emotion” (p.189). He acknowledges that feelings are not, as previously maintained, a “secondary concern” (p.189) and need to be accommodated into any comprehensive account of emotion. However, Solomon does not simply resign himself to the view that emotions are ‘judgments plus affects’ but suggests instead that we should incorporate what are traditionally called ‘affects’ into the category ‘judgment’. Appealing to Heidegger, Solomon notes that the major part of our dealings with the world are practical and engaged, rather than theoretical and detached. Given this, he invokes the category of kinaesthetic judgments or “judgments of the body” (p.191) and argues that the so-called ‘affective’ dimensions of emotion can be reinterpreted as judgments, given a greater emphasis on practical, habitual judgments. Such an emphasis is defensible because “it is only as an embodied and mobile social being that we have any but the most primitive cognitions about the world” (192).

This widening of the category ‘judgment’ raises the question of just what, according to Solomon, a ‘judgment’ actually is. Solomon first addresses this issue in detail in the seventh essay, ‘On Emotions and Judgments’ (1988). He explains that judgments, in his sense of the term, are not reasoned actions or conscious appraisals but largely tacit structures that are “prereflectively constitutive of experience” (p.95). In other words, they are structures through which a meaningful experiential world appears to us. It is clear then that emotional judgments are not explicit choices. In fact, Solomon notes that they are more like perceptual judgments, in that they are “pre-reflective and inarticulate” (p.97). But this points to a problem for his account. Solomon’s conception of ‘judgment’ does not seem to entail that all or even most judgments involve responsibility. It is by no means clear that I am responsible, in any informative sense, for my perceptual judgments. I would have great difficulty in making the computer I am sitting in front of appear to me as anything other than a ‘computer’. My perceptual judgments are the way in which the world strikes me. I might, through various bizarre activities and with a great deal of practice, make my computer appear to me as something else, but such an indirect conception of responsibility could arguably be applicable to just about any aspect of life. The claim that we are responsible for our emotions, which rests largely on the claim that emotions are judgments that we make, is therefore threatened.

This problem is even more apparent in ‘Thoughts and Feelings’, where Solomon states that animals make judgments, such as “whether something is worth eating, worth chasing, or worth courting” (p.187), and also acknowledges that animals are not responsible for their emotions. Yet, if judgment does not point to responsibility, it is unclear how Solomon’s argument for responsibility can be sustained. What’s more, if cases such as fish feeding and cats chasing mice are to be admitted as judgments, the category ‘judgment’ appears broad enough to accommodate some of the most automated behaviours. Hence the concern arises that ‘judgment’, if widened so as to incorporate the bodily changes that are generally taken to be partly constitutive of emotional experience, becomes so general as to risk being uninformative. Indeed, it seems to accommodate even those Jamesian physiological occurrences that Solomon has been excluding all along. If ‘judgment’ incorporates activities such as gaging the height of the stairs as you’re running up them, working out the speed of a ball that you’re running to catch and all other aspects of bodily ‘know-how’, then it might as well incorporate everything. Is the dilation of my pupils during fading sunlight a judgment?

These concerns aren’t really alleviated by Solomon’s most lengthy discussion of judgment and responsibility in the final essay ‘On the Passivity of the Passions’ (2001). We are told that “what characterizes freedom and responsibility with regard to emotions, one might say, is the appropriateness of the emotion not only to the immediate circumstances but to one’s whole life and character” (p.205). But appropriateness does not imply responsibility. Following this, it appears that Solomon conflates responsibility for one’s judgments with ownership of those judgments. He draws an analogy between emotions and thoughts (pp.206-7), both of which may seem to ‘pop out of nowhere’ but still belong to one. However, it is less than clear that we are responsible for such thoughts. What we are responsible for is the extent to which we culture them and weave them into the narratives of our lives and, more obviously, act on them. However, there are arguably many cases in which a thought is ‘mine’, even though I am not responsible for it. Similarly, that an emotion is ‘mine’ and that it is appropriate in the context of my life does not imply responsibility.

Solomon does acknowledge such problems to some extent and renounces any strong claim to the effect that we are always responsible for all our emotions. Instead, emotional judgment is “a complex, multidimensional phenomenon, some aspects of which are clearly within our control and some of which are not” (p.210). Hence we can admit that some habitual judgments are not ‘under our control’ in any informative sense, whilst maintaining that other emotional judgments, perhaps the majority, are our responsibility. This may well be the case, but the problem remains that the category ‘judgment’ has been watered down to such an extent that the claim ‘emotions are judgments’ doesn’t really tell us very much at all. It is not even clear that certain bodily judgments can be distinguished from what are commonly called affects or feelings. For example, suppose I feel an intense and debilitating pain in my leg as I approach a flight of stairs. Could one simply re-describe this feeling as the practical or bodily judgment that I can’t get up the stairs?

So, what is left of the strong claim that we are responsible for our emotions? It seems that we are responsible for certain emotions and to varying extents. In addition, given that judgments are multifarious, it is not even clear that the same notion of ‘responsibility’ will be applicable to all cases. What does remain intact though is Solomon’s longstanding pragmatic claim that it is beneficial for us to think of ourselves as responsible for our emotions. Such a stance, he argues, can motivate us to take responsibility in those instances where it is indeed possible to do so. It might also widen the arena of responsibility, given that social attitudes towards emotion and responsibility are themselves partly constitutive of the scope of responsibility.