Notes and Fragments

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Immanuel Kant, Notes and Fragments, edited by Paul Guyer, trans. by Curtis Bowman, Paul Guyer, and Frederick Rauscher, Cambridge University Press, 2005, 690pp, $140.00 (hbk), ISBN 0521552486.

Reviewed by Steve Naragon, Manchester College


When Heinrich Heine noted the difficulty of writing Kant's life history -- since he had neither a history nor a life -- Heine was perhaps favoring wit at the expense of truth, if not by much; but it certainly is true that Kant's literary remains traveled rather farther than the man ever did, and suffered more at the twistings of large forces and somewhat smaller scholars. Scattered, lost, in part destroyed, sometimes stolen, and occasionally rediscovered (most of this commotion the result of World War II and its Cold War aftermath), the literary remains of one of the world's great philosophers are gradually being put to order and presented to the public in published form. It is a convoluted story, and this isn't the place to retell it, although a few remarks will help position the present book under review.

Roughly ninety years after Kant's death in 1804, the German philosopher and scholar Wilhelm Dilthey inaugurated the so-called "Academy edition" of Kant's writings and served as its first general editor. This was a project begun under the auspices of the Prussian Academy of Sciences (thus the edition's name), with the first publication -- two volumes of Kant's correspondence -- appearing in 1900. Publication was continued by various successor academies, including the present Göttingen Academy of Sciences and the Berlin-Brandenburg Academy of Science, and is now near completion, after more than a century of labors, and after overcoming the hiatuses of war and the passing away of editors. The eventual publication of vol. 26, the student notes on physical geography, will bring to a close the edition as originally planned, although there will likely be re-edited volumes appearing in the future.

Dilthey conceived the series as falling into four sections: I. Kant's published writings (vols. 1-9), II. Kant's correspondence (vols. 10-13), III. Kant's literary remains, or Nachlaß (vols. 14-23), and IV. Student notes from Kant's lectures (vols. 24-29). The third section -- Kant's Nachlaß -- was to consist of manuscripts stemming from Kant's own hand other than his correspondence. This included notes written in the margins and on interleaved pages of his books (both his own published writings as well as books by others, including textbooks used in his classroom), notes on loose sheets of paper, and various drafts of his writings (some that were published, others that were never completed or simply left unpublished).

The volume under review is the latest installment of The Cambridge Edition of the Works of Immanuel Kant under the general editorship of Paul Guyer and Allen W. Wood, publication of which began in 1992. This volume is a highly readable translation into English of selections from the Nachlaß section of the Academy edition, primarily of Kant's annotations in the textbooks from which he lectured and notes written on loose sheets. It is the first translation of its kind into any language, and promises to serve as a welcome stepping stone into the otherwise forbidding world of Kant's Nachlaß (although the definitive guide regarding availability and provenance is still Werner Stark's Nachforschungen zu Briefen und Handschriften Immanuel Kants, 1993).

Considerable selectivity was necessary, given such a wealth of materials, and the editor has omitted altogether the notes on the natural sciences (mathematics, chemistry, physics, and physical geography), anthropology (other than those pertaining to aesthetics), natural law, and philosophy of religion, some of which is slated to appear in future volumes of the Cambridge series. This leaves us with a selection of Kant's notes on logic, metaphysics (including natural theology), moral philosophy, and aesthetics, along with Kant's annotations to his copy of his Observations on the Feeling of the Beautiful and the Sublime (1764) -- this last being of particular interest because of the early attention Kant pays to certain issues in moral philosophy, such as his comments on the intrinsic value of the good will, the dependence of religion on morality, and the centrality of freedom. In terms of disciplinary emphasis: Of the little more than half of the book that consists of translated text, about two-fifths is devoted to metaphysics, a fifth each to moral philosophy and aesthetics, and the remainder to logic and the selection from Observations. Each of these sections comes with its own brief introduction, along with a general introduction, all of which are quite helpful.

Some mention should also be made here of the textbooks from which Kant lectured, since a few uncertainties cropped up in the introductory material. Of the twenty or so books that Kant likely used in his lectures, only six have been located and, of these, three were destroyed or lost during World War II (viz., Achenwall on natural law, Eberhard on natural theology, and Baumgarten's introduction to practical philosophy), although Kant's annotations had fortunately already been transcribed and printed in the Academy edition (vols. 18-19). Of the remaining three textbooks, two are of Baumgarten's metaphysics (the 3rd and 4th editions, housed in Gdansk and Tartu, respectively), and the last is of Meier's logic (also in Tartu), although the 3rd edition copy of Baumgarten -- re-discovered by Werner Stark in July 2000 -- was likely not used as a textbook in the classroom, judging from its annotations, which remain unpublished (on these details see: The annotations from Kant's copy of the Meier logic and the 4th edition Baumgarten, reprinted in vols. 16-17 of the Academy edition, are invaluable and comprise much of the present translation.

This is not a book that many will read straight through. Its value lies rather in its use as a reference, to be consulted alongside Kant's published texts -- and here it is all but indispensable. Just one example. Kant added a "refutation of idealism" to his second edition (1787) of the Critique of Pure Reason, in which he argued that our awareness of ourselves in time is possible only when mediated by an awareness of objects outside the self. It's an interesting argument, and has received its share of scholarly attention over the years. There are various other passages in Kant's published texts that are relevant to this refutation, perhaps the earliest being his claim in the Nova dilucidatio (1755) that a conscious mind requires a body, since it cannot be the cause of its own inner changes; but anyone hoping to fully appreciate this argument, and the extent to which it occupied Kant, must also turn to his many reflections, such as the note written in 1775 in his copy of Baumgarten, which blends together the refutation with an early sketch of his discussion of causality that would appear in the "second analogy of experience" section of the Critique (Refl. 4675). This, and a dozen other passages like it (all of which are easily located using the volume's index), shed considerable light not just on the development of Kant's published views, but also on how Kant continued to refine those views.

The editorial endnotes to this volume also explain many of Kant's historical and philosophical allusions, and they are particularly useful for locating related texts in Kant's published writings, as well as other passages in the Nachlaß and in the student lecture notes, especially those on moral philosophy and anthropology. Many readers will easily lose themselves in the enjoyable pursuit of some topic while jumping from one passage to the next.

Kant's "notes and fragments" are obviously useful for studying the development of his philosophy, a recent example of which can be found in Guyer and Wood's introduction to their translation of Kant's Critique of Pure Reason (Cambridge, 1997). But working through these reflections can be more than "just" an exercise in the history of ideas or in the intellectual biography of a great philosopher. To trace the tentative contours of Kant's arguments, to follow the evolution and the accretion of illustrations and counter-arguments, and then to study the finished product in Kant's published writings, wins the reader not only insight into Kant's own beliefs, but also a firmer grasp of the philosophical problem wanting to be solved -- not unlike the difference between studying a well-crafted piece of furniture, and watching the craftsman actually work on the piece in his shop.

Kant would often remind his students that his goal was to teach them not philosophy, but rather how to philosophize, and with that same spirit we might imagine him presenting to us these notes for our close study.