Notes for a Romantic Encyclopaedia: Das Allgemeine Brouillon

Placeholder book cover

Novalis, Notes for a Romantic Encyclopaedia: Das Allgemeine Brouillon, David Wood (ed., tr.), State University of New York Press, 2007, 290pp., $36.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780791469736.

Reviewed by Jane Kneller, Colorado State University


David Wood's translation of the unfinished collection of notes that Novalis (pseudonym of Friederich von Hardenberg) intended as "material for an encyclopedics" is a welcome contribution to the growing literature in English on the philosophy of the early German romantics. The fact that these are "unfinished" notes should by no means deter the reader. This is an important set of short essays, aphorisms, fragments and musings on the sciences and the nature of systematic knowledge. In true early romantic fashion it is wide-ranging in content and style, touching on topics from art to experimental method in the sciences, from philosophy and religion to butter softening, colic, gout, fever and the symbolism of human dress. Taken as a whole, the notes represent the beginnings of a philosophical experiment that, if successful, would support the hypothesis that a unified methodology is possible for the arts and sciences. Novalis' vision was that this could only be carried out successfully by philosophers who were both scientists and poets, and who could "treat the sciences both scientifically and poetically."[1] The Notes for a Romantic Encyclopaedia, or the Allgemeine Brouillon as the editor of the 1929 German edition called it (literally, "general rough draft"), is a preliminary gathering of materials that Hardenberg hoped to pull together into a book that would embody the ideal practices of any science: "All good researchers -- physicians, observers and thinkers, proceed like Copernicus -- They turn the data and methods around, to see whether or not they fit better this way" (92, #517). It was to be a book that would model the artistry, or at least the aesthetic dimension, of scientific practice. What Novalis called the "magic wand of analogy" is at work throughout these notes. Musical terminology is used to illuminate physiological claims, chemical terms describe religion, etc. This book deserves to be read not simply for its many poetic moments ("Philosophy is really homesickness -- the desire to be everywhere at home" (155, #857)) but for the overall vision that gives the poetry its theoretical punch. That lovely characterization of philosophy, for instance, when read in the context of the surrounding material (it follows a comment on the nature of pain and pleasure, motion and interruption, and the feeling of powerlessness), is presented as a medical diagnosis: Philosophy is a symptom of human vulnerability.

The spontaneous balancing of poetic and technical terminology in Hardenberg's notes, often in the same sentence, makes the task of translating the Brouillon particularly delicate. Wood handles it with both artistry and precision and the result is a very fine, readable translation. Wood's explanatory footnotes are extremely helpful and erudite. The addition of an appendix containing excerpts from the notes Hardenberg took during his technical and scientific studies in Freiberg, while simultaneously composing the materials for the Brouillon, is extremely useful for clarifying parts of the latter. The two sets of notes translated here, when combined with a study of Novalis' literary output during this same time, should provide scholars with a clear sense of the breadth, depth and philosophical coherence of this brilliant thinker's work. Wood's introduction sets the Brouillon in its philosophical context, giving readers a sense of the historical and theoretical importance of this "mass of notes" (xii). In the process Wood also makes clear that these notes are the effulgences of a remarkably gifted and creative philosopher/poet.

Wood stops just short of claiming that this is the most important of Novalis' philosophical works, so it is worth briefly comparing it to the other set of notes on philosophy, Novalis' earlier and more orthodox Fichte Studies. In the spring of 1795 the budding poets Hölderlin and Hardenberg, ages 25 and 23 respectively, met the rising star of German philosophy, Johann Gottlieb Fichte, for one evening in Jena. For the young Novalis, the meeting resulted in 400 manuscript pages of notes inspired by his subsequent study of Fichte's philosophy and what Novalis took to be the fundamental flaw in it. The philosophical bulk of the work involves Novalis' attempt to get beyond Fichte's views. These so-called "Fichte Studies" mark the beginning of young Hardenberg's entry into philosophy, and according to the leading scholar of early German romanticism, Manfred Frank, they are the period's "most significant philosophical contribution." Although he may not have intended it to do so, David W. Wood's edition of Novalis' Das Allgemeine Brouillon challenges Frank's assessment.

The Fichte Studies were Novalis' first serious foray into philosophy, and the Brouillon was his last. The two were written approximately two years apart. (The Fichte Studies ended in the early weeks of 1797 as Novalis was overwhelmed by the impending death of his fiancé Sophie, and work on the Brouillon was begun already in the late summer of 1798.) After Sophie's death in 1797 Novalis plunged into collaboration with the famous Jena circle of romantics and also began studies at the premier technical institute in Germany, the Mining Academy in Freiberg. It was there that he worked under the renowned geologist Abraham Werner, and studied chemistry, physics, and mathematics as well as geology and mineralogy. By the close of the following year he had met Goethe, continued contact with Schiller, and written and published his famous collection "Pollen" and the essay "Faith and Love." It was during this period, in the heat of his combined scientific and artistic fires, that he forged the idea of a "general encyclopedic" -- a unified account of the methodologies of all the sciences and arts. By September of 1798 he was taking notes for his new enterprise. Work on the Brouillon continued steadily over the next three months, but it already began to run aground by the end of the year. In January 1799 he was writing to Friedrich Schlegel that he had run out of ideas for it.

Compared to the Fichte Studies, whose aim, after all, was far less grandiose, the Brouillon might appear to be a failure. Yet Wood argues that the Brouillon is Novalis' "most mature philosophical work" (xxx) and "one of the most remarkable undertakings of the Golden Age of German philosophy" (xi). In his Introduction, Wood has managed to provide a strong argument for these claims and in so doing he casts doubt on Frank's characterization of the Fichte Studies as the more important contribution to philosophy. At the same time Wood is careful not to suggest that the later work supersedes the earlier philosophical views, and he does not claim that Novalis' philosophy developed "exponentially" to a new level during his short but intense tenure as the paradigm early romantic. Hence Wood refers to the Brouillon only as "more mature," and no doubt that is true. But he also makes the case for reading the Brouillon as a unique and significant contribution to philosophy by dint of the sheer audacity of Novalis' vision. Wood calls the work "astonishing" and "bold" because Novalis "tried to combine the spheres of poetry and science" (xv). Wood further argues that Novalis' daring was matched by his qualifications to carry out his self-appointed task. Novalis was by that point in his life the only early German romantic who was established both as an artist and as a highly successful student of the physical sciences:

Novalis differed from the other Romantics insofar as he was academically qualified and professionally trained in the sciences. Although he criticized certain scientific results and approaches to science, he only did so from within, so to speak (xiv-xv).

Wood acknowledges that Novalis remained philosophically committed to his early definition of philosophy as an activity aimed at an ideal that could be approached only asymptotically. Novalis did not give up the anti-foundationalism of the Fichte Studies. This raises the question, in what sense is the Brouillon more mature? Wood's answer is contained in the last three sections of his introductory essay.

In an earlier section on the "Bible Project" Wood begins by arguing against a religious interpretation of Novalis' reference to his book as "a scientific Bible." The interpretation is tempting, he argues, given the romantics' keen awareness of Lessing's prior call for a "new, eternal gospel". However, Wood argues, Novalis' Brouillon

was not at all concerned with Lessing's Bible and a new Christian gospel as such. Rather, its aim was much more universal, with its basis rooted in the empirical and philosophical sciences (xviii).

The fundamental claim of the Brouillon, according to Wood, is that "All science is one" and the reference to "a scientific Bible" meant simply that his finished book would provide a "single unified book of the sciences" (xix).

In the section on "science and romanticizing" he emphasizes not only the extent to which Novalis incorporated scientific studies into the work (he wanted to classify "all scientific operations") but, equally importantly, the degree to which Novalis relied on "the special status of mathematics" as a methodological model that could be carried over into non-mathematics contexts. Wood discusses the notion of "potentializing" or "exponentializing," drawn from Novalis' famous definition of romanticizing as raising the world to a higher power: "in this operation the lower self becomes identified with a better self. Just as we ourselves are a potential series of this kind. This operation is still entirely unknown." Wood concludes that this has new ramifications for art and philosophy as a means of raising nature to higher power.

In the section on "Magical Idealism" (Novalis' somewhat eccentric sounding view that the world of nature can be transformed "at will" by imagination), Wood adds fuel to the claim that the Brouillon surpasses Novalis' earlier work. Arguably, the Brouillon is more important than any of his other theoretical texts for understanding Novalis' much misunderstood term "magical idealism" as a designation for his own philosophy. Wood proffers a straightforward reading of the term: "As the name ["magical idealism"] suggests, it was a combination of the idea of romanticizing and an extension of transcendental idealism" (xxiii). That is, transcendental idealism had relativized human experience to the human cognitive faculties, making human beings, within the limitations of those faculties, authors of the nature that they perceive. Novalis' "magical" or romanticizing move simply adds that humans can become reflectively aware of these capacities, and hone them consciously. Artists of all sorts can in this sense purposively reconstruct nature via moral ideals and progressively more poetic imaginations. Moreover, when scientists and philosophers become artists and vice versa they become "magical idealists" (51, #338). These artists of nature can transform the world into a welcoming "Thou" rather than an alienating and alienated threat (151, #820).

Finally, Wood makes clear that even in an age of encyclopedias, the enterprise that Novalis undertook was truly unique. Wood's point is that Novalis aimed at an ideal of an "absolute universal science" that would embrace Fichte's individual-experiential starting point while rejecting the view that such an absolute could ever be attained fully. This is the sense in which the romantic encyclopedia would be a "higher Wissenschaftslehre" for Novalis. Unfortunately, it never materialized. Had the book appeared, Wood's argument seems to show that it most certainly would have been "his most mature and original theoretical work" (xxiii). Can the same be said for the preliminary notes for this project?

If Manfred Frank's assessment is correct, the answer must be negative. Yet Wood's brief introductory essay and the work itself make a strong case in favor of the Brouillon. The Fichte Studies contain a straightforward critique of Fichte and present a relatively clear suggestion for correcting it. It is for this reason that Manfred Frank can correctly point to their special and lasting significance for philosophy. At the same time, one of the fundamental claims of the Fichte Studies is that what has traditionally been known as "philosophy" must be distinguished from "philosophizing." The new, romantic philosophy is actually an activity, and an open ended one at that:

Philosophy must be a unique kind of thinking. What do I do when I philosophize? I reflect upon a ground. The ground of philosophizing is thus a striving after a ground … if this [ground] were not given, if this concept contained an impossibility -- then the drive to philosophize would be an unending activity … that would therefore never cease. Unending free activity in us arises through the free renunciation of the absolute -- the only possible absolute that can be given us and that we only find through our inability to attain and know an absolute (FS, #566).

The Brouillon, however it might have ultimately turned out as a book, would not have been the same kind of text as the Fichte Studies. The latter was indeed less "mature," for the reason that these early philosophical notes did not themselves embody the romantic definition of the open-endedness of philosophy. A genuinely successful romantic philosophical book would have to enact its own agenda. The Brouillon, on the other hand, was to be an attempt to demonstrate on its very pages the activity of philosophizing, or "scientizing" as Novalis liked to say. Had it been completed it would have no doubt alternated between scientific reports, mathematical proofs, essays, poetry and art. If Novalis had been alive today, it would very likely have incorporated film, interactive websites, perhaps even chatrooms -- anything that would lead us, as Novalis would say, to "the psychology, if I may express it so -- of the sciences as a whole" (9, #56). Wood's translation and introduction allow us a glimpse of what might have been a brilliant project, and leave us with plenty of philosophical material to reflect upon in the meantime.

[1] From his "Kant Studies." Novalis Schriften: Das Philosophische Werk I, ed by Richard Samuel, Hans-Joachim Mähl and Gerhard Schulz (Stuttgart: W. Kohlhammer, 1981), III:390 #45.