Nothingness and the Meaning of Life: Philosophical Approaches to Ultimate Meaning Through Nothing and Reflexivity

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Nicholas Waghorn, Nothingness and the Meaning of Life: Philosophical Approaches to Ultimate Meaning Through Nothing and Reflexivity, Bloomsbury, 2014, 299pp., $112.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781472531810.

Reviewed by David Lee Stegall, Clemson University


Nicholas Waghorn's book takes its inspiration from a familiar problem, which plagues any offered answer to the question "What is the meaning of life". Whatever one offers, be it an achievement, trait, crystalized idea, etc., can always be undermined by what Waghorn labels "the problem of reflexive iteration". Reflexive iteration is defined by him as "the capacity one has to draw limits to a certain thought or experience, and then proceed to project the possibility of continuance of that thought or experience beyond those limits" (p. 102). In short, if one says that the meaning of life is to serve the needs of others, one can always be faced with the reply of "so what", or "what makes 'serving others' so special that it can be a true bedrock". Waghorn calls this our ability that "For any end point or limit we reach, there seems the possibility of moving past it, which puts it into question" (p. 3). Seeing reflexive iteration as a universal solvent, a threat to any thing one could offer as "the meaning of life", leads Waghorn to his main question: Could "Nothing" or "nothingness" be the one "candidate to be presented which disrupts our ability to carry out such iteration"? And so Waghorn sets himself the task of using Heidegger, Carnap, and Derrida to see if one can, without question begging, define/understand "Nothingness". If one could do so, one could then proceed to see if "nothingness" could be a means of avoiding reflexive iteration.

Before offering a summary/outline, let me praise several of the book's aspects. It has clear merits. At one level, it is refreshing to see clear, respectful but non-slavish expositions of key ideas in Heidegger, Carnap, Derrida, Searle, and Wittgenstein, among others. Waghorn moves with clarity and confidence between the Continental and Analytic traditions. At another level, his text reflects intellectual integrity, a refusal to question beg or dodge real impediments. Let me illustrate what I mean by "intellectual integrity" via a humorous analogy. Reading the book, I was reminded of a Dilbert cartoon, in which a harried employee tells Dilbert that "at last, I've gotten agreement from the committee on this document". Dilbert asks "Was this the document that was supposed to discuss workplace safety", and the harried employee says "Yes, originally, but it evolved into a document on the mating habits of squirrels". Waghorn's text, though hoping to focus on "the question of the meaning of life", permits itself and indeed requires of itself, a long preliminary discussion of Nothingness, a discussion that is then admitted to have undercut optimism about handling the question of the meaning of life. Waghorn's text is thus haunted by the ghost of Derrida's "differance", that any statement can be differed with and that any discussion represents a partial deferral of the full topic. Or as Waghorn notes, "Derrida is keen to avoid the idea that there might be some fundamental way of understanding anything which is not subject to the possibility of reinterpretation or misinterpretation" (p. 34). Let me quote from Waghorn on this impasse.

My aim was to undertake an investigation into the nature of 'nothing' for I felt that nothing was the only candidate that might block the regress with regard to meaning that we find when we search for ultimate meaning. . . . [but this strategy] turned out to be implausible . . . . [for] All accounts of 'nothing' appeared implicitly or explicitly to beg the question against their rivals . . . . Matters quickly grew worse. For it appeared that, just as the investigation into nothing itself seemed to go badly awry, so did the questions that had guided that investigation. (p. 228)

When he quotes Derrida's phrase "this bottomless chessboard", the reader feels that Waghorn is offering a version of the bottomless chessboard. In short, skepticism is fully respected by him, rather than dismissed or tucked away in a footnote.

While Waghorn cannot claim to have done what he set out to do -- Define Nothingness and use this as a way to stop reflexive iteration on the question of the meaning of life -- his is truly a very rich and rewarding "thwarted journey". It is a pleasure to read his precise analyses of Heidegger's the nothing (das Nichts), and to see Waghorn tease out the key Carnapian replies. Waghorn then resolutely sets aside the Derrida roadblock (the roadblock that any 'saying or explaining of Nothing will be incomplete, undermined by the acid of differance'), and takes the reader on a foray through a host of proffered definitions of "nothing". Chapters three and five offer discussions of "nothing" that revolve around negation (to negate everything would leave "nothing") and modal logic. Of particular interest is the discussion of 'intuition' as a tool for approaching Nothing. Henri Bergson's analysis/intuition distinction, as well as Bergson's suggestion of resorting to metaphor and poetic language, is addressed via a discussion of Stanley Rosen's work. Waghorn is especially enlightening in his discussion of the false but persuasive reasons we as a species may have for privileging experiential or intuitive knowing over analysis. He notes that poetic, metaphoric language does not refer to but claims to "recreate the relevant experience"(p. 119). And this is at best a mixed (and probably false) promise, for "then our theory would collapse into the process of living life, just without theory" (p. 120), an animal life-world. Waghorn is fair and evenhanded in granting that "Intuition and its deliverances are amenable to meaningful talk . . . up to a point. . . . [but ] no-one can provide a discursive account of how this mechanism operates" (pp. 80-81). Thus here, Rosen, as well as Waghorn's other protagonists (Heidegger, Wittgenstein, Derrida) run up against the limits of language.

Chapter four is a discussion of dialetheism, addressed by Waghorn as a way to handle pronouncements such as "nothing is a thing and nothing is not a thing", and "nothing is something and nothing is nothing", etc., (p. 96). Chapter six is his fullest and quite rewarding discussion of how he sees Derrida's presence in this treatise. As he opines "it will be my contention that we cannot really argue with Derrida . . . . if we want to argue with Derrida, we need to argue with him without arguing with him. . . . we will need to argue without argument" (p. 125). Waghorn takes Derrida's statement that "there is nothing outside the text" to be a warning to us that there is "no safe place to stand outside of the play of differing and deferral", so we are always checkmated from the first move. One can avoid the skeptic, only "by fiat" (p. 139), and such a dodge undermines any progress one could then achieve. But again, it is a pleasure to read Waghorn's statement "Let us press on" (p. 142), to fully face the skeptic and yet keep the passion of inner reflection and intellectual rigor. This is the virtue of Waghorn's text -- his combining of maximal respect for skepticism with maximal humorous pleasure in the contest of thinking -- in short, a refreshing strength without the false crutch of dogmatism. I take Waghorn to be aware of this 'joie de vivre' skepticism that he is exemplifying, when he discusses, as an aside, Cavell's worry about the 'truth/threat' of skepticism, the seduction to "strip ourselves of the responsibility we have in meaning . . . one thing rather than another . . . . [springing] from the desire to abandon shared forms of life" (p. 147). In short, I see Waghorn's engagement with skepticism as being one of 'that was fun, and productive, and let's do it again', a robust rather than escapist or disengaged skepticism.

In Chapter seven,.Waghorn seeks to answer:  "What impact does the foregoing discussion have on the meaning of life?" (p. 166). He uses Thaddeus Metz's argument that while life may have contingent or limited meaning, there is no ultimate meaning that one could offer, that could withstand reflexive iteration. Metz offers the helpful suggestion that commonly offered answers to the meaning of life have a family resemblance, though no central core unites the diverse limited or local meanings we ascribe to our lives.

Waghorn reviews the work of Robert Nozick on this theme, devoting most of his interest to Nozick's notion of "Ein Sof" (meaning: 'without end or limit') (p. 185), as an answer to the question of the meaning of life. So that, in a fashion, one can say "everything" or "the whole grand and horrible mess" is the ultimate meaning of life, everything and nothing. Waghorn offers a series of criticisms of Nozick's Ein Sof, and in particular sees that the issues of clarity, question begging, etc. that plagued the use of the term Nothingness will be equally a problem for Ein Sof or "the immeasurably great" (p. 187). Waghorn now ties a bow on his argument, concluding via Nozick, that "I would suggest that this is because the answer to the question "What is the ultimate meaning of life?" is 'nothing' . . . . What one decides to take as the ultimate meaning of life depends on what one decides to take as one's concept of 'nothing', of what content one decides to give it" (p. 187). Waghorn refreshingly adds that "So, in applying the notion of 'nothing' to the issue of the meaning of life, I have managed to say nothing on the subject" (p. 188). Again, I have to stress that this is not a mocking of the reader who has journeyed along with Waghorn, but more a "Canterbury Tales" moment, where the individual stories and asides have made for a very satisfying journey, though the stated task (pilgrimage) seems to have faded into the background. As Waghorn notes, "this book, which ultimately says nothing regarding the meaning of life, but, I hope, says nothing in a rigorous manner" (p. 190). He then offers a brief chapter on Eastern and Western religious notions of the meaning of life (and of nothingness), using Buddhism and Christianity as his two examples. Waghorn notes that whatever their merits, these views or creeds are as perspectival and question begging as any other view that starts with a set of presuppositions, as all views must do.

As Waghorn notes in his conclusion, his book saturated with the "attempt to be rigorously self-aware," including "trying to be self-aware about my self-awareness" (p. 232). Barthes once noted that "I have a disease. I see language." Waghorn's book is an extended "disease", wonderfully and frustratingly self-aware of language, of the limits of language, of the tension between the emotive versus cogent/rational echoes within the question of the meaning of life. This text would be most appreciated by readers of philosophy who can see the passion and honor within robust skepticism, the power of the mind to stab itself and not be deterred (or deferred) by the stab and the stabs to come.