Novalis: Fichte Studies

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Kneller, Jane (ed.) Novalis: Fichte Studies, Cambridge, 2003, 242pp, $21.99 (pbk), ISBN 0521643929

Reviewed by Violetta L. Waibel , University of Tubingen and University of Vienna


Jane Kneller’s translation and edition of Novalis’ (Friedrich von Hardenberg’s) Fichte Studies is a significant contribution to the existing editions and translations into the English language of basic philosophical texts of the Romantic Period. In contemporary scholarship Novalis’ Fichte Studies is considered to be the most important text of the German philosophical romantic, and it deserves to be acknowledged that Kneller has undertaken a difficult and demanding task in translating the complete text of this collection of philosophical studies, annotations, and intellectual experiments, and that she has mastered them admirably.

The translation is based on the 1960´s edition of Hans-Joachim Mähl and presents the text according to the six groups of manuscripts which Mähl identified and coordinated with six working periods between fall 1795 and fall 1796. It is very helpful to the reader of this English edition to find the working periods shown in the headlines, something the German edition, for example, does not do.

The editor’s introduction contains a short biography of Novalis, a summary of the most important philosophical thoughts and theses, a discussion of Novalis´ reception and critique of the early Fichtean Wissenschaftslehre of 1794/95, and a review of the most important interpretations of the Fichte Studies. Finally, Kneller discusses the reception and the relevance of the Fichte-Studies in modern analytic philosophy. Attached is also a short survey in tabular form of Novalis’ biography.

What the reader misses, not only in this edition, but also in the whole series of the Cambridge texts, is a general bibliography of the past editions of the text (including foreign language editions). This information in the field of history of philosophy is of high value in order to locate the text within the context of past and contemporary discussions and receptions. Another convenience to the reader would be a general survey of the research works on the text in question. Many editions today offer these helpful surveys that allow a first-hand, rapidly accessible overview of the already existing research on the text. It would be desirable if the Cambridge texts could appropriate this helpful practice. In the valuable chapter “Further Reading” that follows the biography, Kneller presents a very good annotated survey of texts that discuss Novalis’ philosophy, or that give portions of a translation of the Fichte Studies. However, this chapter is limited to works written in English.

Hans-Joachim Mähl was the first editor of the total set of manuscripts; he not only arranged them but also gave them the title Fichte Studies. Indeed, there are many passages in the text which are directly related to Fichtean terms and theses. However, there are also many terms and theses in the text that are related to Kant and other. Mähl himself recognized only a small portion of the Kantian parts of Novalis´ manuscripts, especially those related to the Kantian categories. Manfred Frank, to whose interpretation Kneller is evidently indebted, has drawn attention to Novalis’ Kantian usage of categories, ideas, and postulates, and their merely regulative instead of constitutive status. Kneller touches on this suggestion of Frank’s without sufficiently deepening it. Following Frank, she emphasizes the role of Novalis´ stay in Jena in 1790/1791 and his contact with the teachers of the Kantian philosophy, Karl Leonhard Reinhold and Carl Christian Erhard Schmid (earlier Novalis´ private tutor). In this period in Jena Novalis also met Friedrich Schiller, and others. A short survey, or at least a hint of the philosophical studies and discussions that were in progress in Jena at the time would be helpful to the reader. These discussions and their participants are known through the recent works of Manfred Frank, and especially through his important book Unendliche Annäherung. Die Anfänge der philosophischen Frühromantik (Frankfurt am Main 1997). It is astonishing that Kneller seems to ignore this book even though Frank´s research is so important for her interpretation. In this work, Frank places Novalis´ Fichte Studies within the intense post-Kantian discussions in Jena. He mentions the famous participants in these advanced philosophical discussions in this period, such as Karl Leonhard Reinhold, Carl Christian Erhard Schmid, and Johann Gottlieb Fichte. This list is supplemented by names of less known participants such as Friedrich Immanuel Niethammer, Friedrich Karl Forberg, Johann Benjamin Erhard, and Franz von Paula von Herbert.

With regard to the philosophical development of Novalis, it should be noted that, when he left Jena, he explicitly wrote in his farewell letter to Reinhold that he was going to continue not only his juridical studies in Leipzig (which failed in Jena and Leipzig, as Kneller correctly mentions) but also his philosophical and even mathematical studies (see Novalis´ Schriften (NS), Vol. IV, 97). This is of importance in so far as Leipzig is the location of the beginning of the philosophical friendship between Novalis and Friedrich von Schlegel. The dialogue between these friends played a key role in the philosophical development of both of them. The contents of this dialogue are not yet sufficiently known and require further research. These early philosophical experiences of Novalis most likely influenced the development of the Fichte Studies and should be considered in more detail in future research.

More than once Kneller mentions the legendary meeting of Novalis, Fichte and Hölderlin in the house of Friedrich Immanuel Niethammer in Jena during the summer of 1795 (see Kneller, xi and xiii; and NS IV, 588 and 997). It must be stressed that there are no documents to prove that this event actually occurred; we have only the fact that J.L. Doederlein said he remembered reading about the meeting in Niethammer’s (subsequently lost) diary. The same is the case with regard to the presumed support given to the young Fichte by Novalis´ father, and the inference from this support to an early acquaintance of Fichte with the Novalis family. The only evidence for the support is a remark of August Coelestin Just in his obituary of Novalis, published in 1805, four years after Novalis´ death (see NS IV, 536-550; Kneller xxii). Intense investigations by the author of this review could not bring more light into these oft-repeated, merely presumed facts. Therefore, it must be stressed that these claims should be handled carefully and should not be taken as proofs of Novalis’ familiar acquaintance with Fichte or his personal contact with Hölderlin.

Kneller’s short survey of the main topics in each group of manuscripts of the Fichte Studies is helpful to the reader. Her diagnosis, however, of Novalis’ “long detours,” “diverging from Fichte´s line of thought” (Kneller, xvii) is problematic because it presumes that the so-called Fichte Studies are nothing more than Novalis’ critical annotations to Fichte’s Wissenschaftslehre. I have already indicated that this is not true. Like most interpreters of the Fichte Studies, Kneller understands number 566 as the most important and most fascinating reflection of the whole collection. She finds here Novalis´ claim for philosophy as an “unending free activity” (contrary to her own intention, she writes incorrectly, “ending free activity”, see Kneller, xxi), that she judges to be one of the results of Novalis´ own philosophy.

Kneller’s review of recent interpretations of the Fichte Studies is valuable and carefully worked out. In presenting Theodor Haering’s interpretation in his book Novalis als Philosoph (1954), Kneller does not pay attention to the fact that, when Haering wrote his book, he did not have access to the new and totally revised edition brought about by Hans-Joachim Mähl in 1960. Haering offers an Hegelian interpretation that considers Novalis´ encounter with Fichte’s thought as the source of his own philosophy and of his going beyond Fichte. Another Hegelian interpretation that Kneller presents is the work of Géza von Molnár, Novalis “Fichte Studies”: The foundations of his Aethetics (1970). Molnár was the first to introduce English readers, already familiar with Novalis as a romantic poet, to Novalis as a philosopher. He, too, read Novalis in a Hegelian way. In addition, he also worked out some Kantian moments of th. Fichte Studies such as the interpretation of the Fichtean “I” as a regulative idea, a possibility that seems to him to be promoted by the Fichtean thought experiments concerning the self-consciousness, and by the dynamic structure of the all-present interrelation.

Kneller correctly considers Manfred Frank as the Novalis interpreter who recognized the independence of the early romantic philosophy from the theory of subjectivity and self-consciousness. Therefore, Frank takes Fichte, more or less, as a catalyst to Novalis’ own philosophy. Frank sees much importance in Novalis´ idea of the ordo inversus, which Kneller mentions only very briefly. The ordo inversus is a second turn, the turn towards objectivity and therefore a supposed cancellation of the well known Kantian Copernican turn towards subjectivity. It is regrettable that Kneller takes into consideration only Frank’s dissertation, Das Problem der “Zeit” in der deutschen Romantik: Zeitbewußtsein und Bewußtsein von Zeitlichkeit in der frühromantischen Philosophie und in Tiecks Dichtung (revised edition, Paderborn 1990), and the Einführung in die Frühromantische Ästhetik (Frankfurt am Main 1989), but not his recent book Unendliche Annäherung: Die Anfänge der philosophischen Frühromantik (Frankfurt am Main 1997), as I have already mentioned above. Another important interpretation of the Fichte Studies is William Arctander O´Brien´s book, Novalis: Signs of Revolution (Durham and London 1995), that Kneller reads as a postmodernist interpretation that goes far beyond the interpretation of Manfred Frank. According to O´Brien, Novalis´ modernity consists in a linguistic and semiotic turn. O´Brien stresses that Novalis´ reflections on linguistics and semiiotics are central, although they constitute less than half of the reflections. Number eleven of the Fichte Studies is the most important for this interpretation. In addition to Kneller´s presentation it should be mentioned that Fichte´s early contribution On the Faculty of Speech and the Origin of Language is central to Novalis´ theory of signs and to O’Brien’s interpretation.

In the final paragraph of her introduction, Kneller outlines the importance of the Fichte Studies within contemporary philosophy. She first alludes to the Kantian Copernican turn to discover and then to determine precisely the philosophical location of the Fichte Studies within the tradition after Kant. According to Kneller, Novalis agrees with the Kantian refutation of unjustified precritical metaphysical claims. Furthermore, he seems to have learned much from the reconstruction of Fichte´s theory of the “I”, even if this theory contains all the Cartesian problems of a philosophy that takes self-consciousness as the one and only first principle of the theory of knowledge. Novalis based his own philosophical position on these pillars of his close philosophical studies. In accordance with Manfred Frank, Kneller recognizes the merits of Novalis´ theory of emotion and of self-feeling, the latter being judged as more fundamental than the cognitive form of self-consciousness. Most important to Kneller´s reading of Novalis is the thesis of philosophy as an unending form of philosophical activity. In the above mentioned work of Manfred Frank, Unendliche Annäherung. Die Anfänge der philosophischen Frühromantik, Kneller could have found this thesis developed. Moreover, Kneller understands Novalis as a predecessor of the late Wittgenstein, and even of postmodernism that declares the end of philosophy. Another voice that comments on the modern idea of the reciprocity of philosophy and art ascribed to Novalis´ is Stanley Cavell in his work, In Quest of the Ordinary: Lines of Scepticism and Romanticism (Chicago 1988), where he speaks of the “reduction” of poetry and philosophy (see Kneller, xxxii and Cavell, 75). Finally, Kneller´s conclusion deserves assent: “…….There is no reason, from Novalis´ perspective, to choose between philosophy and poetry. […] To philosophize and to poetize are to romanticize.” (Kneller, xxxiii).

It is beyond question that the fine translation is the main interest of this edition. It is well known that each translation is also an interpretation of the text. Kneller shows herself very sensitive to the intricacies of the German text. She tried to translate as literally as possible even when the German syntax is at its limits of intelligibility. Thus Kneller mediates well the quality of this Novalisian text, in which reconstructions of Kantian or Fichtean theses, pretentious speculative passages, successful or failing thought experiments, and annotations in the manner of a diary are melted together.

There remains a hope that the English-speaking scholars will discover very soon the rich possibilities of this provoking and challenging romantic philosopher, who does not merit to be known merely to insiders.

I am grateful to Lara Ostaric for her careful revision of this paper.