Nozick, Autonomy and Compensation

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Dale F. Murray, Nozick, Autonomy and Compensation, Continuum, 2007, 156pp, $110.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780826488862.

Reviewed by Peter Vallentyne, University of Missouri-Columbia


In this nicely written book, Dale Murray critically discusses the moral rights posited by Robert Nozick in Anarchy, State, and Utopia. His focus is on these rights and not on Nozick's arguments about the justness of the state. He argues that Nozick's rights to compensation give rise to rights to government-financed health care and that Nozick should recognize a natural right to enough goods to ensure a reasonable chance of living a decent and meaningful life (if feasible for all). Murray also discusses issues such as the role of invisible hand arguments, moralized conceptions of freedom, and the issue of whether just steps (transactions) preserve the justice of situations.

Nozick, of course, posits a Lockean libertarian theory of rights: initially each individual fully owns herself and has the moral power to appropriate natural resources as long she satisfies the Lockean proviso of leaving enough and as good for others. Murray argues that such rights fail to do enough to ensure that everyone has adequate life prospects and concludes that they should be rejected. I fully agree with this criticism of Nozick's right-libertarianism. There is, however, a form of libertarianism -- left-libertarianism -- that is not obviously subject to this criticism.

Left-libertarianism agrees with Nozick's right-libertarianism that each agent initially fully owns herself. It also agrees that agents have the moral power to appropriate natural resources as long as enough and as good is left for others (the Lockean proviso). It disagrees with Nozick's minimalist reading of the Lockean proviso. Nozick held, roughly, that it requires only that no one be made worse off compared with non-appropriation. This is a very weak requirement in that it allows all the gains from appropriation to go to the first claimant instead of being shared generally. There are, however, stronger ways of interpreting the Lockean proviso. One interpretation requires that everyone be left an equally valuable share of natural resources. Another requires that appropriators pay the competitive value of the rights claimed to promote equality of opportunity for wellbeing. A more moderate version of the Lockean proviso (defended by John Simmons in The Lockean Theory of Rights, ch. 5) requires that, where feasible, appropriators leave enough resources for others to have an adequate opportunity for preservation, comfort, and independence. This is close to Murray's right to a reasonable chance of living a decent and meaningful life. Given the possibility of these other versions of Lockean libertarianism, Murray's wholesale rejection of libertarian rights is premature. It would have been useful to discuss how tweaking the Lockean proviso can, or cannot, avoid the problems that Murray identifies.

Murray, then, argues that there is something like the right to adequate life prospects. There is, of course, an issue of what the criterion of adequacy is, but I shall not worry about that here. It's probably based on some kind of appeal to the satisfaction of basic needs. Instead, I want to consider two general ways of assessing life prospects: one focuses on prospects for wellbeing (quality of life) and the other focuses on prospects for an autonomous life.

Murray (following Loren Lomasky roughly) rightly thinks of autonomy as rational self-direction, which is roughly the effective freedom to reflectively shape one's life in accordance with one's reflectively formed and chosen life plan. On most plausible conceptions of wellbeing, living autonomously is a very important part of wellbeing. It is not, however, all there is to wellbeing. The presence of pleasure or joy and the absence of pain or suffering are also important parts. Moreover, although more controversially, living autonomously is not lexically prior to the other elements of wellbeing. At least sometimes one's life goes better with more joy and less autonomy. I therefore believe that the right to adequate life prospects should be understood broadly in terms of prospects for wellbeing and not narrowly in terms of autonomy. Although Murray writes of a reasonable chance of living a decent and meaningful life, he tends to think of this as an autonomous life (especially when discussing the right to health care). It would have been useful to have a more careful discussion of this issue.

Let us turn now to Murray's defense of the right to basic health care. He offers two defenses. The first works within the context of Nozick's theory. Those who violate rights owe compensation to their victims. The government has violated the rights of its citizens (e.g., by funding projects that produce acid rain and car pollution and by providing subsidies for tobacco) and thereby harmed their health. Thus, it owes compensation. Compensation must, if possible, take the form of repairing the damage done. Thus, the government owes health care to its citizens.

Let us examine each step. Has the government violated the Nozickean rights of citizens in ways that harm their health? Clearly it has. For example, innocent individuals have been severely beaten by police officers. Murray, however, needs something more widespread than this. He suggests that funding projects (e.g., highways or tobacco production) that lead to ill health violates the rights of those who suffer the ill health. This seems wrong. Funding such projects violates no Nozickean right. Those who produce pollution by driving or smoking may violate a Nozickean right, but the funders of such projects do not. So, it's not clear to me that Murray's argument gets off the ground.

Suppose, however, that the government has systematically violated the rights of citizens. It does not follow that compensation is owed, since the net effect of government activities on the health of each citizen may be positive, or at least non-harmful. Murray suggests, however, that it is harmful for many citizens once one factors in the effects of government restrictions on access to positional goods such as luxury goods and education. I never really understood, however, how this was supposed to work.

Suppose, then, that the government has systematically wrongfully harmed the health of its citizens. Murray claims that such harms to health must be compensated by provision of health care. I see little reason, however, to hold this view. Harms to health can typically be compensated by benefits that have nothing to do with health. What matters is the overall effect on a person's wellbeing and not just the health impact. Murray, of course, is not alone in holding that there are spheres of wellbeing and that harm to a sphere requires compensation internal to that sphere. It seems quite implausible to me, however.

Suppose, then, health care is owed to citizens in virtue of government wrongs. It does not follow that each citizen may be taxed to compensate those who have been wronged. We are here assessing Murray's argument that Nozick's libertarianism requires government provision of basic health care. Libertarianism insists that compensation is owed by the violator to the victim, and not by all to all. Murray addresses this issue by noting that: (1) Some tax dollars come from those responsible for the wrongful harm and those dollars can be dedicated to health care of those who were harmed. (2) Compensation is owed for exposing individuals to the risk of wrongful harm and not merely for the harm if it occurs. Thus, a much wider range of people owe compensation for the harms to health. (3) Compensation is owed not only by the violators but also by those who have benefited from the violation. The first point seems plausible, but the second two points are highly controversial and greater discussion would have been helpful.

The above argument for the government's duty to provide basic health care is internal to Nozick's libertarianism. Murray further defends this duty by appealing to the (non-Nozickean) right to adequate prospects for an autonomous life. Basic health, he plausibly claims, is a requirement for basic autonomy. As he is careful to note, however, the right to health care justified by this argument is limited to basic health care. Moreover, the justified basic health care is age-sensitive. It does not justify, for example, any significant duty to provide health care to the elderly who have already lived a full autonomous life. Murray is admirably clear on these limitations.

The book is well written and often insightful. The main shortcoming is the absence of discussion of how the right to adequate life prospects might be accommodated by a more stringent reading of the Lockean proviso.