Nozick's Libertarian Project: An Elaboration and Defense

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Mark D. Friedman, Nozick's Libertarian Project: An Elaboration and Defense, Continuum, 2011, 212pp., $120.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781441170934

Reviewed by Matt Matravers, University of York


The object of this book is 'to take stock of the natural rights libertarian project' as it stands three and a half decades after Nozick's Anarchy, State, and Utopia (hereafter ASU) 'and to advance it as far as we are able in the face of existing objections' (2). ASU might be thought an unlikely subject for an elaboration and defence; whatever else is true of Nozick's work, it is written in a crystal clear style. That said, this is a timely book politically if not philosophically. A significant part of a mainstream political party in the USA is committed to an ill-thought-out libertarian anti-statism. If such people are to find some kind of intellectual underpinning for their beliefs it is, I suppose, better they should look to Nozick than to the fantasies of the likes of Ayn Rand.

Friedman is motivated by something different. On the first page, he introduces 'the notoriously liberal academic establishment' that he believes refuses to give libertarian arguments a fair hearing.[1]Unfortunately, Friedman's response is to write as if engaged in a political war of us (right-thinking libertarians) against them (prejudiced liberals), often to the detriment of philosophical nuance. That said, Nozick's Libertarian Project gives a good overview of many of the arguments in ASU. In short, in many places it succeeds in elaboration. Sadly, it does not do so when it comes to defence.

Nozick starts ASU with a famous declaration: 'Individuals have rights, and there are things no person may do to them (without violating their rights). So strong and far-reaching are these rights that they raise the question of what, if anything, the state and its officials may do'.[2] The argument of the rest of the book follows from these claims. Nozick does not say a great deal about the origins and nature of these rights, hence Nagel's criticism that his account is 'without foundations'[3].

According to Friedman this criticism is 'somewhat overblown' given 'the standards generally applied to political theories' (3). I confess to having no idea what that means, but in any case -- overblown or not -- it is to the problem of establishing foundations for natural rights that Friedman turns in chapter 1.

A brief introduction to the idea of natural rights via Locke establishes the need for a 'systematic' and 'coherent' account of the basis of such rights (11). In searching for such an account, Friedman looks first to Ayn Rand. His objections to Rand take two forms: first, that her conclusions are incompatible with our common-sense idea of the content of morality. Second, that Rand's attempt to provide a foundation for natural rights in an essentialist account of human nature fails. The force of the first of these objections is reasonably disputed (one might think that if our best theoretical account of morality leads to conclusions incompatible with our current moral practices, then so much the worse for those practices), but the force of the second is undeniable. What Rand says about human nature and about the derivation of duties from that nature is embarrassingly bad and Friedman makes short work of shredding it (11-15).

Rand dismissed, Friedman turns his attention to Nozick. One task in reconstructing and defending Nozick, then, is to unearth the apparently missing foundations. As I take this to be the most significant task for Friedman -- as I think does he -- it is the main focus of what follows.

Whereas Rand seeks and fails to ground natural rights in what she claims are facts about human nature, Nozick, Friedman claims, pursues 'a completely different strategy'. Instead of looking for a 'top-down' theory based on a full blown account of the essence of humanity, Nozick pursues a (presumably bottom-up) 'political' strategy of showing that 'only the libertarian conception of rights as side constraints against aggression is compatible with our pre-theoretical beliefs regarding the moral status of persons' (16, emphasis in the original). Despite the emphasis, it is not clear what is meant by 'political'. The best interpretation may be that whatever it is, it is 'not metaphysical'. That is, instead of relying on meta-ethics, it relies on first-order, substantive moral arguments. In any case, the substantive argument that Friedman offers is as follows. It is, he thinks, at worst consistent with Nozick's position and at best an accurate articulation of that position.

  1. Persons (and potential persons) enjoy a special moral status, meaning that their individual interests are entitled to great moral weight.
  2. The special moral status of persons (and potential persons) renders them morally inviolable, i.e., there are side constraints on how they may be treated.
  3. Persons are rational agents.
  4. Persons are inviolable because they are rational agents.
  5. Persons have a right to exercise their rational agency without interference, subject only to the equal rights of other rational agents.
  6. Therefore, the use of force or coercion against innocent persons (those not engaged in aggression or fraud against other persons) interferes with their rational agency and is therefore morally impermissible (20).

Friedman offers this as a 'proof', but in the end (as he acknowledges) the issue is whether the overall political theory on offer is more 'persuasive' than 'rival political/ethical' theories. So, how persuasive is it? Consider the claims Friedman makes in favour of his five premises.

Many readers will agree that persons have a certain special moral status (premise 1), although I very much doubt it is a moral commitment shared 'by virtually all persons who have had the opportunity to reflect on it' (23) (some animal rights theorists will insist that 'specialness' comes with sentience; Gauthierian constructivists will think that the premise begs the question, and so on).

Premise 2 is slightly harder to evaluate as it is not clear exactly what Friedman takes it to mean. It seems that the special moral status of persons establishes usually inviolable standards of treatment. That is, there are things (what things, we do not know at the moment) that (usually) cannot be done to persons no matter what the results for overall welfare (22-24).

Friedman says very little about premise 3 (24) and what he says is mostly about free will, but the thought seems to be that persons can generally be held to be responsible for their actions insofar as/because persons are reasons-responsive. Premise 4 holds that it is in virtue of our rational agency that human beings have special moral status.

The argument for premise 5 begins with words likely to cause suspicion in any moral theorist: 'it seems obvious', says Friedman, 'that the application of force or the threat of force . . . will interfere with the exercise of [persons' rational agency]' (26). Whether it is obvious or not rather depends on what is meant by force and by interference. Friedman accepts that those with an inkling of what's coming will already be distinguishing in their minds between forced organ donation and 'forced' general taxation (28), but whether any such distinction is legitimate -- and so the meaning and obviousness of this premise -- is postponed for discussion in the next chapter.

Friedman's decision to try to present the argument as a 'proof' is, I think, a mistake. Even as it stands, the argument struggles against any such standard not least because the meaning and scope of the key terms (what side constraints? what counts as force? what are the limits of inviolability? and so on), is yet to be determined. Moreover, given that he accepts that the persuasiveness of the argument depends on whether it strikes us as more plausible than the alternatives as a means of organising our social, moral, and political lives, he does not need to deploy this faux-logical style. In the end what is presented, and needs elaboration, is the following: autonomous persons (which is all adult, functioning human beings) have a special moral standing such that they should be free from interference in living their chosen lives, including interference justified by an increase in general welfare.

Many deontologists, and many people who share Friedman's 'commonsense moral judgments' (32), will agree with the above. But that is precisely the point: until we know what is involved in force, coercion, the content of the side-constraints, and inviolability, we cannot judge whether or not this is an attractive picture. Unfortunately, Friedman seems to take the argument to have established particular, substantive, claims. Thus, Chapter 2 begins with the claim that an implication of the 'proof' is that 'innocent persons may not be coerced, including for purposes of redistributing resources' (32). Now, the argument entails that innocent persons may not (usually) be coerced (assuming that coercion is a form of interference in rational agency). That holds whatever the purpose of the coercion -- except insofar as the purpose may reveal something about the limits of inviolability (hence the 'usually') -- but nothing in the argument so far allows the implication that 'redistributing resources' is a form of coercion. That has to be established (and never is).

Chapter 2 of Friedman's book gives an account of Nozick's 'entitlement theory'. The theory famously consists of three principles: a principle of just acquisition, a principle of just transfer, and a principle of justice that holdings are legitimate only if they arise from the repeated application of the first two.

Issues of just acquisition excite (Right- and Left-) Libertarians and the occasional Marxist or Anarchist in ways that perplex the rest of us. For what it is worth, Friedman defends the claim that acquisition, up to and including the final act that appropriates the last piece of unappropriated capital, can meet the 'as much and as good' test if the appropriator improves the capital, since what matters is that all have the opportunity to use, not to appropriate, resources. Since those who have been denied ownership by the appropriation by others of all capital can still rent or purchase the (improved) capital of the world, they have not been made worse-off. Thus, Friedman concludes, 'if privatization harms no one else and the acquirer increases the value of the claimed resource through her own labor, then I believe we are morally compelled to recognize her full right to this property' (38, emphasis in the original). Others interested in just acquisition can quibble over whether having the opportunity to rent or purchase is 'as good as' having the opportunity to acquire. Much more interesting, I think, is the surreptitious introduction of the word 'full' here. The argument, if it works, shows that the person has justly acquired her property. Nothing has been said about what follows from just acquisition. Perhaps one thing that follows is that one has some rights in one's property -- for what else is it to have property -- but where did the notion of 'full' rights come from (and what does it mean)?

Friedman moves quickly over transfer and rectification (38-40). He seems strangely keen to downplay Nozick's own concerns about the illegitimacy of actual initial acquisition. Focussing on historical injustices, he concludes that 'it seems intuitively obvious' (that phrase again) 'that the normative force of any demand for rectification diminishes with the number of generations intervening between the occurrence of the injustice and the time the wrong is addressed' (40). But worries about the legitimacy of historical acquisition are not merely worries about who now might be required to pay whom for past injustice. Rather, for a 'historical theory' such as the entitlement theory, if the original pattern of entitlements was illegitimate, that illegitimacy passes down through the generations. Current entitlements are legitimate if, and only if, they came about in accordance with the demands of just acquisition and just transfer, which contemporary holdings clearly did not. Hence Nozick's intriguing suggestion that we might go for a one-off redistribution according to Rawls's difference principle so as to start afresh with a legitimate baseline.

Having established what the entitlement theory is, Friedman goes on to defend it against challenges from (amongst others) Nagel (to the Wilt Chamberlain example) (42-44), G.A. Cohen (to the account of justice in acquisition) (60-65), and from left-libertarians in general (65-75). The quality of the argument varies considerably depending on the degree to which Friedman's conviction that Nozick is right and his opponents wrong interferes with his ability to appreciate the opponents' arguments.

Chapter 4 moves the argument on to the justification of the minimal state. Friedman sets out the argument concisely (77-79) before joining Nozick's critics in finding it wanting. The rest of the chapter is then given over to an alternative account grounded in a libertarian principle of fairness (96).

Up to this point, the chapters in Nozick's Libertarian Project have followed a certain pattern of exegesis -- first of Nozick and then of his critics -- followed by ripostes to those critics. The concluding Chapters (5 and 6) are more concerned with libertarianism generally.

Chapter 5 defends the empirical claim that property rights are intimately connected to liberty by offering thumbnail sketches of the historical development of Britain (107-111), Germany (111-115), and Mexico (115-20). Given the constraints (the survey of British history from 1204 to the present lasts just four pages), the empirical value of these sketches depends on whether one is independently convinced of the case.

Chapter 6 attempts to defend libertarianism generally as a plausible public philosophy. It depends, as it should, on the theory that has preceded it. Friedman happily embraces the language of the undeserving versus the 'deserving' -- or sometimes the 'innocent' -- poor, only the latter of whom can expect assistance and then only in 'truly desperate' circumstances (144), but I doubt those who would be made angry by this will have persevered this far. As has been said many times about Nozick's ASU, if you are not convinced that, for example, holdings are absolutely held and that one form of interference is much like any other and all equally bad, there is nothing in Nozick -- or Friedman -- that will change your mind.

[1] This of course leaves me in something of a quandary in that whatever I say in criticism of Friedman's book will probably only reinforce his view. For this reason, perhaps it is appropriate to declare an interest: insofar as I am (broadly) a Gauthierian constructivist, I am not an egalitarian and, according to some of my Rawlsian friends, barely qualify as a liberal (let alone a member of a notoriously liberal establishment).

[2] ASU, Basic Books, 1974, 3.

[3] T. Nagel, 'Libertarianism Without Foundations', in Paul (ed.), Reading Nozick, Rowman and Littlefield, 1981.