Insurrection and Intervention: The Two Faces of Sovereignty

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Ned Dobos, Insurrection and Intervention: The Two Faces of Sovereignty, Cambridge University Press, 2012, 236pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521761130.

Reviewed by Daniel Viehoff, University of Sheffield


It is widely held that domestic rebellion against a non-democratic and illiberal government is often legitimate where intervention by outsiders -- even well-intentioned outsiders whose goals are exactly the same as the rebels' -- would not be. (Few commentators think that the Syrian rebels have no right to fight against the Assad regime; yet many believe that other states have no right to enter into the conflict.) Ned Dobos' Insurrection and Interventions asks what, if anything, justifies this asymmetrical judgment.

Over the course of seven carefully argued and engagingly written chapters Dobos assesses various arguments that have been advanced against outside intervention even where a government could not legitimately be overthrown by its own citizens. Chapter 1 discusses the argument from 'communal self-definition' that has been offered by Michael Walzer to explain why outsiders are presumptively barred from intervening even when a state fails to uphold the human rights of some of its subjects, who would thus themselves be permitted to resist that government.

Having found Walzer's argument wanting, Dobos considers in the next three chapters whether the asymmetric treatment of insurrection and intervention can be explained by basic principles of just war theory. Chapter 2 discusses empirical evidence that outside intervention is more costly and less likely to succeed than internal resistance, and that it thus falls afoul of basic standards of jus ad bellum where insurrection does not. In Chapter 3 Dobos turns to the philosophically more intriguing proposal that the standards of proportionality and success that govern jus ad bellum make different demands on insiders and outsiders. Insiders, but not outsiders, are permitted to fight even at a minimal chance of success if they are resisting the violation of what Henry Shue has called 'basic' rights. And outsiders, but not insiders, are required to take into account harmful mediated consequences -- that is, consequences that arise from the actions of others, for instance, the actions of a government that will only become more repressive when threatened by rebellion or outside intervention -- when determining whether their actions are proportional. Chapter 4 moves from questions of jus ad bellum to considerations of jus in bello. Dobos focuses here on the principles of discrimination and proportionality, and considers both whether there is reason to believe that outsiders are more likely to violate these standards, and whether these principles apply asymmetrically to internal rebels and external interveners.

Chapter 5 proposes that many constraints on outside intervention are in fact justified, not by the rights of the target state or its subjects, but by the obligation that the intervening state has to its own citizens: a government must not use the resources of its citizens -- including their lives or the lives of its soldiers -- to pursue ends that the citizens have not entrusted to it. (Dobos, following Allen Buchanan, calls this the problem of 'internal legitimacy'.) In Chapter 6 Dobos assesses (and ultimately rejects) an objection to particular interventions that is often heard in public debates: that the intervening states enforce international norms selectively -- intervening here but not there -- and that this undermines the legitimacy of their actions. Chapter 7 finally considers whether the UN Security Council's authorization must be sought if international intervention is to be legitimate, and whether, even if it need not be sought, seeking it might bear on the legitimacy of intervention.

Dobos' final conclusion is measured and might yet surprise many readers. He takes no stance on whether the asymmetric treatment of insurrection and intervention is justified all things considered. But he asserts that, if it is justified, that justification must be based on prudential considerations (intervention but not insurrection fails to meet applicable standards of proportionality or success) or concerns about internal legitimacy, and not on the perhaps rather more common worry that interventions but not insurrections are imperialistic, paternalistic, or hypocritical.

Among the distinctive virtues of the book is that Dobos takes very seriously -- more seriously than is common in contemporary philosophical discussions of war and violence -- the thought that states make a moral difference to their citizens, and yet avoids the opposite mistake, of buying too easily into claims about sovereignty and a concomitant right to non-intervention that many states make for themselves. Still, at crucial moments in the argument he exaggerates the differences that states make, and he attributes moral significance to states that is better located elsewhere. To show this I want to consider for the remainder of this review two central arguments Dobos advances in support of the asymmetry claim: that jus ad bellum imposes different standards of success and proportionality on rebels on the one hand, intervening states on the other; and that internal legitimacy limits the right to intervene but not the right to rebel.

That we hold insiders and outsiders, rebels and interveners, to different jus ad bellum standards of proportionality is suggested by the following example. A threatens B's life without justification. C could intervene to protect B from A; but then A would likely kill not only the innocent B but also a significant number of other innocent people. Given that the costs of the intervention (the loss of many innocent lives) are disproportionate to its benefits (protecting one innocent life), it might reasonably be concluded that C is not permitted to intervene to protect B. But imagine instead that B himself could resist A's threat. Once again, A would in response likely kill not only B but also a significant number of other innocent people. Yet, Dobos avers, even though the costs of B's self-defence are disproportionate relative to the benefits, "we would surely not condemn B for defending himself." (81) It appears, then, that we hold rebels and interveners to different standards insofar as we seem to permit rebels to defend themselves even if their self-defence brings about mediated harm -- harm brought about by another agent -- that is disproportionate to the goal they are pursuing, but we make no such allowance for outsiders who intervene.

What could explain this asymmetric treatment of rebels and interveners (which, Dobos points out, runs counter to the 'Defence Axiom', a "basic principle of moral reasoning" (87) according to which "other-defence is supposed to be permissible wherever self-defence is permissible" (73))? The main argument Dobos considers in support of this asymmetry posits that states (but not sub-state rebel groups) have duties of care to outsiders because states (but not sub-state rebel groups) claim the privileges of sovereignty under international law. This would explain why states, but not rebels, must take into account the mediated harm to innocent bystanders that follows from their actions. And thus it explains why rebels are permitted to defend themselves where outsiders would be prohibited from intervening on their behalf.

Dobos himself notices that this argument raises a difficulty. It seems to entail that state S is not permitted to defend itself against an outside attack by state T if, by so defending itself, S makes it sufficiently more likely that other states (U and V) also start a war and the war between U and V would lead to a greater violation of innocent lives than could be prevented if S defended itself against T's attack. Dobos' solution to avoid this counterintuitive conclusion is that, "Even if states do owe a duty of care to foreigners, like other positive duties this one must be subject to a high-cost proviso such that it does not bind when the sacrifice associated with discharging it is too great." (96-7) So the state is permitted to resort to war "despite the expectation of excessive mediated harm, while this proviso would be unavailable to a state considering humanitarian intervention where its own survival or core national interests are not at stake." (97)

Still, the argument Dobos offers has the counterintuitive implication that it should matter to our assessment of the situation whether the intervener, C, is a state or a non-state actor. If the duty of care is special to states, then, while it would not be permissible for the US to intervene to protect B from A, it would be permissible for Amnesty International to raise an army to defend B from A even at the cost of disproportionate mediated harm. But that seems implausible: if there is an interesting difference in the standards of proportionality that we apply to different actors, then this should intuitively track not the distinction between states and non-state actors but that between agents who are fighting for their own lives (or, more generally, their own basic rights) and agents who are fighting for the lives and rights of others.

And indeed Dobos' own discussion provides us with the resources to develop an argument that takes just this form: both B and C have a duty of care to consider the mediated harms that their use of violence might bring about whether they are states or not. Yet that duty of care is (as Dobos himself concedes in his discussion of a state's right to self-defence) limited by a high-cost proviso: the duty is moot when the agent's own survival or core interests are at stake. So a symmetrical treatment of states and non-state actors, and of insiders and outsiders, nonetheless leads to asymmetrical conclusions about insurrection and intervention. Rebels who are fighting for their own lives (and, more generally, to protect their own basic rights) are not bound by the duty of care to others on whom mediated harm is imposed through the actions of the oppressive government. By contrast, others (be they foreign states, foreign NGOs, or even the victims' fellow citizens) whose own lives or basic rights are not at stake continue to be bound by the duty of care, and thus must not intervene where such mediated harm outweighs the benefits of intervening. No independent work is done by appeal to either agent's statehood.

In Chapter 5, Dobos argues that the asymmetry between insurrection and intervention reflects at least in part the duties intervening states have to their own citizens. States have legitimate power only insofar as they have either been given actual consent by each citizen or (much more commonly) if they act as the trustees of their citizens. Put differently: where I have not consented to the state's use of my resources (including my life and my obedience), it has a right to use my resources only if, by doing so, it serves me. So unless S's intervention in another state T serves S's citizens, that intervention violates S's duty to its own citizens and is illegitimate.

Dobos rightly sets aside the simple-minded view that service here requires advancing the citizens' self-interest. We have duties that it is not in our self-interest to fulfill, yet someone can serve us by helping us discharge these duties. Dobos accepts instead that the state can serve its subjects not only be advancing their self-interests but also by helping them discharge their duties of justice. Yet even on this more generous understanding of service, he argues, the range of cases where intervention is internally legitimate is very limited indeed. In particular, the government cannot pursue a humanitarian intervention where its citizens have no duty to intervene. But there is no duty to intervene unless either we are responsible for a rights violation based on past interaction or 'basic' rights are threatened. There is, for instance, no duty to intervene simply because a foreign government fails to respect and protect freedom of speech or to hold regular democratic elections. Consequently unless a state bears special responsibility for rights violations abroad, its intervention there is only internally legitimate in the most extreme cases of human rights violations. Since domestic insurrection is permissible (Dobos assumes) even where non-basic human rights are violated, considerations of internal legitimacy play a central role in accounting for the asymmetry between insurrection and intervention.

One question worth raising here is why the state's legitimate exercise of power should be limited to serving us by helping us to abide by duties that we have, rather than by helping us, more generally, to conform to reasons that apply to us. And we surely have a reason to help others whose rights are violated even if this reason does not rise to the level of a duty. Now a state that would act on these reasons would also have to consider whether, by using its citizens' resources, it is not simultaneously setting back their capacity to conform to other, more important reasons elsewhere. But establishing this requires considering the costs of intervening, and what could have been achieved if these resources had been deployed elsewhere. It certainly does not justify the assumption that intervention is internally illegitimate simply because the state's citizens have no moral duty to intervene.

This puts pressure on the internal legitimacy argument for asymmetry from one direction: it expands the range of cases where outside states can intervene while complying with the demands of internal legitimacy. But just as importantly for Dobos' project, we can put pressure on the asymmetry claim from the opposite direction. Concerns about internal legitimacy need not be special to states but can also arise for non-state political entities, and thus they may limit the actions of rebels as well as outside interveners. Dobos' apparent assumption, that there is no such concern, is plausible only if we assume that the rebels are using only their own resources, and that each person supporting or participating in the rebellion has freely chosen to participate in the insurrection. But at least in some cases this is quite implausible. If an insurrection is started by an entity -- say, a tribe or a military unit -- that is governed by structures of authority, or if the insurrection is financed by the sale of natural resources (such as diamonds) ownership over which quite plausibly belongs to all those living in the area;, then a similar question about internal legitimacy arises: why should the rebel group be permitted to use these resources for the sake of overthrowing the regime? The question might often be easier to answer in the case of insurrection than that of intervention, either because the support on which the rebels depend is indeed wholly voluntary or because the rebels are fighting for the rights and interests of those they draw on for support. But at least in principle we must consider problems of internal legitimacy not only for intervening states but also for domestic groups rebelling against an oppressive government.

Dobos thus overestimates at times the moral distinctiveness of states. Yet this should not distract us from recognizing the significant contribution he makes both by highlighting that the widely accepted asymmetry between insurrection and intervention is in urgent need of justification, and by bringing into focus the importance that structures of political authority have for justifying it. His book deserves attention, not just from philosophers, legal theorists, and political scientists who work on humanitarian intervention, but also from those working on just war and political authority more generally.