Number and Numbers

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Alain Badiou, Number and Numbers, Robin Mackay (tr.), Polity, 2008, 240pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780745638799.

Reviewed by John Kadvany, Policy & Decision Science/


Like many philosophers, Alain Badiou relies on technical systems of mathematical logic as a foundation for philosophical exploration. Donald Davidson used Tarski's theory of truth for formal languages to ground his approach to natural language semantics. Modal logic is frequently used to discuss problems of necessity, time, or belief. W. V. O. Quine made the reduction of mathematics to set theory a paradigm of "ontological commitment," such that an idealized formalization of physical science identified the entities needed to ensure the theory as fundamentally "real." Indeed, Badiou's project is exactly in this Quinean mode, with set theory his preferred tool. While Badiou's set-theoretic interpretations are not typical of those found in Berkeley or Princeton, the overall strategy is nonetheless "analytic." Hence one's response to Number and Numbers, and a similar earlier book, Being and Event, will depend on a) the philosophical narrative laid over the mathematics, and b) the treatment of the mathematics vis à vis the interpretation.

This review follows those two themes. But first a word on intellectual context. Badiou is one of several French philosophers pilloried by Alan Sokal and Jean Bricmont in Fashionable Nonsense: Postmodern Intellectuals' Abuse of Science (1998). Sokal, of course, authored the sham 1996 Social Text article, concocted as a meaningless essay in high lit-crit-theoretic style, and buttressed by facile, often bogus or inconsistent, appeals to quantum physics or relativity, all undetected by the editors. The hoax was widely reported in the popular press and Sokal has since continued his manic crusade, though with much less panache and success. One of Sokal's "tests" for intellectual value is whether one can detect a difference in meaning if key words are interchanged, say "being" and "other," or "mediation" and "reification," or whatever -- sort of a Turing test for intellectual quality. For Badiou in Fashionable Nonsense, Sokal and Bricmont, as they so often do, just selectively quote him, rhetorically ask the reader if it makes sense (of course not, devoid of context), and then go on. The second trick could be applied to Number and Numbers, perhaps with some honesty, but I think ultimately unfairly, as explained below. Badiou's ontological narrative is allusive, poetic, and deeply metaphorically inspired by his understanding of modern set theory. And Sokal's "reversal" test also fails. Badiou's vision is a wholly consistent one, built indeed from a stimulating historical account of the treatment of number by Gottlob Frege, Guiseppe Peano, Richard Dedekind, and Georg Cantor.

Badiou's vision in brief: he despairs the lack of objectivity and relativism implicit in the "linguistic turn" -- whether of Lacan, Foucault, and Derrida, but probably equally much Rorty or Searle -- and so seeks a directly ontological alternative, somehow avoiding constructivist methods. Badiou, probably not noticed by Sokal, is in this way a conservative French philosopher, accepting modernist heterogeneity, but believing it to be mere appearance. The structure of Being, for Badiou, enables us to cognize it in excessively, possibly disastrously, manifold ways, exploring paths of innumerable options, scenarios, frames, and templates, with the whole an inconsistent multiplicity made up of Being's constituent elements. Our world, any world, is a tiny fragment selected from Being's "multiples of multiples." It's not that being is mathematical, but that mathematical discourse "pronounces" what is expressible of "being qua being." Theories of anything, but mostly the natural and social world as described using numeric methods, are re-presentations of this ontology. Consistent with the primacy of natural science, numbers and numeric structure have to be "immanent" (76, 101, 177), and especially, not "constructed" via syntax, grammar or other inductive procedures, of which Badiou is completely disdainful: "if it is true that mathematics, the highest expression of pure thought, in the final analysis consists of nothing but syntactical apparatuses, grammars of signs, then a fortiori all thought falls under the constitutive rule of language" (48). No Sapir-Whorf hypothesis for this fellow. The need is for an immanent structure of number and numbers, overwhelmingly efflorescent in its structure, persistently unbounded, always already beyond completion in every detail.

Enter modern set theory, particularly Zermelo-Fraenkel (ZF) set theory, already essential to Being and Event. ZF is a mainstream focus of modern set theory and principally used to study varieties of the mathematical infinite. Additionally, most "ordinary" mathematics (calculus, algebra, probability, number theory, geometry, etc.) can be thought of as codified as sets, sets of sets, and so on. In this way, ZF (defined formally in standard predicate logic) may be thought of as a foundation for all types of mathematical representation. Intuitively, ZF starts with nothing, the empty set, ∅. From that, you can form a new set consisting of all of the subsets of ∅; since the only subset of ∅ is ∅ itself, this new set of subsets is just {∅}. Then you can take that set's subsets (i.e. {∅, {∅}}), and so inductively generate partial universes of sets Vn, each mini-universe Vn defined as all subsets of Vn-1. That only leads to finite sets, so a further axiom is needed to guarantee the existence of infinite sets. With that, additional ZF axioms for collecting and redefining sets allow construction of transfinite ordinal numbers α which continue the natural, or counting, numbers into the infinite, and hence the process of set formation in further collections Vα. The set theoretic "universe" V includes all the Vα, and this universe (as called in set theory) initially contains Badiou's desired pure "multiples." Zermelo importantly saw how to maximize set creation while (hopefully) preventing paradox formation à la Russell by not allowing total collections like V to be treated as sets. Each Vα is "small" enough to be a set, but the entire universe, V, is a "proper class," not created by a set axiom and not a member of any set. There are lots of proper classes, including the class of all transfinite ordinals α. The ordinals are the "backbone" of V: they take us as far as we want into the higher infinite, with more sets defined "horizontally" as subsets or members of the Vα. Much set theory is about how far those ordinals may continue, pretty much to the brink of inconsistency. Kurt Gödel believed correctly that proceeding far into the infinite was a way of learning more about ordinary real numbers, meaning all those expressible using infinite decimal representations 3.141592654 … , -1.0, 0.161616 … , etc.

The real numbers return us to Badiou. We use real numbers, or at least arbitrarily precise approximations to them, all the time in natural or social science, engineering, finance, accounting, even carpentry. Prima facie, we need some infinitary set theory, or similar apparatus, for the intelligibility of such practices. Badiou never mentions Quine, but he similarly assumes Quine's reductionist need for numeric representation, and modern set theory as the right setting for ontological justification. The validity of this assumption is discussed below. For now, to get from Quine to the Badiou of Number and Numbers, one just needs the latter's further goal of an overwhelmingly productive set universe. The Vαs, which are Gödel's conception of a cumulative set hierarchy, start to do that, especially with ordinary mathematics represented by sets at very low levels in the vast set universe V. But for Badiou this is insufficient.

To motivate his project, Badiou's book begins with a history of number concepts in the late 19th century, a critical time in the foundations of mathematics. Frege, Peano, and especially Dedekind all had important theories of number incorporated in part by later axiomatic treatments. Frege famously tried to construct numbers from logical principles and came close to succeeding. Peano devised postulates (including a powerful conception of mathematical induction, similar to recursion), which are today codified in first-order logic and the formalism known as Peano Arithmetic -- an avatar of Badiou's "constructive" procedures. Dedekind devised a remarkable conception of real numbers allowing them to be defined in terms of infinite sets of the simpler rational numbers (i.e. "fractions" p/q giving only repeating decimals). And Cantor initiated the modern theory of the infinite. Badiou provides a provocative discussion of the successes and failures of these pioneers in keeping the number concept front-and-center amidst competing foundational goals and philosophical motives. His main point is that the real numbers have been diminished to a "mere" set construct, ultimately becoming just another set with no special ontological status. Set theory also does little to unify the familiar counting, rational, and real number systems as sets. It's not enough to easily define real numbers, calculus, and whatever else you need in set theory. Somehow numbers should be more directly manifested, not constructed, since they are supposed to constitute Being in its elemental design.

For Badiou, vanilla sets alone, starting from the empty set and built by transfinite recursion along the ordinals, don't present the important number families as sufficiently identical. The arithmetical operations possible on Cantor's transfinite numbers (i.e. ordinals) are too limiting because they only generalize counting operations (+ and ×), not the full algebra possible with real numbers (+,-, ×, ÷), nor the reals' rich continuity. The set theoretic universe just doesn't look much like the ordinary real number line, and this Badiou dislikes. In particular, Cantor's transfinite ordinals are discrete, unlike the real numbers. The symbol "ω" is for the first transfinite ordinal, and in set theory it is defined as the set {0, 1, 2, …}. You can add 1 to ω to get ω + 1, which is just the set {0, 1, 2, … , ω}, i.e. ω + 1 = ω ∩ {ω}. But there's no ordinal a between ω and ω + 1, just as there is no counting number n between 2 and 3, or 100 and 101, even though there are lots of such real numbers, like 2.002 or 100.101100111 … . There is some algebra for calculating with transfinite ordinals, but not like the algebra for rational and real numbers. For Badiou, Cantor's great insight, to generalize just the discrete counting numbers into the transfinite, is ultimately an ontological flaw.

The theory of surreal numbers is Badiou's means for making the universe of sets more number-like. Surreal numbers were invented by the Princeton mathematician John Conway in the 1970s, and named by Donald Knuth in his whimsical novelette, Surreal Numbers (1974). Conway's interest was the study of finite, but combinatorially complex, games, like Nim or chess, but his work also applies to cryptography or similarly computationally intricate domains. Conway devised various mathematical games, defined as alternating moves by two players acting on, say, colored lines or tokens, following simple rules. The games can be ordered, like numbers, and associated with numeric values, depending on, say, which player is guaranteed to win. Conway could not only quickly define counting numbers, much as occurs when numbers are defined as sets, but also negative numbers, rational numbers, and the real numbers, the last of these imitating a generalized Dedekind "cut"; hence the key role for Dedekind in Badiou's historical background. It is likewise easy to define all the usual algebraic operations (+,-,×, ÷) for Conway's games. By allowing the games to include an infinite number of choices for players (for which you somewhere need axioms, they aren't free), you quickly get versions of Cantor's transfinite ordinals. The surreal algebra then works for these transfinite ordinals.

So one can define surreal numbers ω/2 or √ω -- infinity divided by 2, the square root of infinity -- and it all works; e.g. ω/2 + ω/2 = ω, ω/3 < ω/2, etc., all of which are meaningless for Cantor. (These surreals are not ordinals, but are defined from ordinals.) Hence there are all manner of ordered surreal numbers "between" the discrete transfinite ordinals, just as with ordinary real numbers. You can now form, for any ordinal α, surreal numbers like 1/α, something infinitely tiny, so to speak, along with 1/α2, 1/α3, and whatever else you want in analogy with the reals. Now the coup de grâce. The standard transfinite ordinals α also form a proper class, a huge entity, "as big as" the universe of sets V. So, imagine adding any and all of the vastly tiny surreal numbers, like 1/α, 1/α2, 1/α3, or whatever, to hum-drum ω. You get a vast universe, an innumerable proper class, between ω and ω + 1, just as between 2 and 3 there are uncountably many real numbers, 2.1, 2.11, … 2.98, 2.99, etc. Similar vast proper classes, versions of V, even exist between surreal 2 and 3, or 100 and 101. For Badiou, that's how you get innumerable number worlds back into the otherwise pallid set theoretic universe, insinuating themselves all around, like a set-theoretic version of fractal geometry. In this way, "the numbers that we manipulate are only a tiny deduction from the infinite profusion of Being in [surreal] Numbers" (211).

Much of Number and Numbers consists of prose and math-lite explications of surreal number properties which Badiou takes as ontologically significant. I find it mostly unconvincing since no connections are made to the ordinary physical, biological, historical, political, and aesthetic ontologies expressed through the habitus of modern life. Instead there are Badiou's remarkable interpretations of set theory and the surreals. Here's an example, indicative of Badiou's Cantorian poiesis. The numbers 0, 1, 2, … themselves are sets, being ∅, {∅}, , … , with these nestings defined via Conway's games if you like, or in ordinary ZF. Recall the plain first infinite ordinal ω, equal to the set {0, 1, 2, …}. Then ω + 1, the next ordinal, is defined as ω ∪ {ω}, or {0, 1, 2, … , ω}. So, like all ordinals, ω + 1 has the property that all its members are also subsets (i.e. is "transitive"). Then:

This property [transitivity] is characteristically natural: the internal homogeneity of an ordinal [α] is such that dissemination, breaking open that which it composes [set element x ∈ α], never produces anything other than a part [subset x ⊂ α] of itself. Dissemination, when it is applied to a natural multiple, delivers only a 'shard' of that multiple. Nature, stable and homogenous, can never 'escape' its proper constituents through dissemination. Or: in nature there is no non-natural ground (80).

Badiou then contrasts successor ordinals, built from addition like ω + 1, from limit ordinals, like ω = {0, 1, 2, …} which have no "last element," as does ω + 1 = {0, 1, 2, … , ω}:

In my view, this contrast is of the greatest philosophical importance. The prevailing idea is that what happens 'at the limit' is more complex, and also more obscure, than that which is in play in a succession, or in a simple 'one more step'. For a long time philosophical speculation has fostered a sacralisation of the limit. What I have called elsewhere [Manifeste pour la philosophie, 1989] the 'suture' of philosophy to the poem rests largely upon this sacralisation… . Every true test for thought originates in the localisable necessity of an additional step, of an unbroachable beginning, which is neither fused through the infinite replenishment of that which precedes it, nor identical to its dissemination … The empty space of the successor is more redoubtable, it is truly profound. There is nothing more to think in the limit than in that which precedes it [e.g. ω has no last element]. But in the successor [e.g. ω + 1] there is a crossing. The audacity of thought is not to repeat 'to the limit' that which is already entirely retained within the situation which the limit limits; the audacity of thought consists in crossing a space where nothing is given.

Badiou's thinking on such matters is entirely consistent, marvelously, sometimes fascinatingly, so. You can't pull a Sokal on him by exchanging key terms. The interpretations do mirror the math, and in terms of audience, a good course in set theory is likely needed to follow it through. Badiou's readings are also provocative. For example, he is right, one rarely considers the successor operation "+ 1" to be problematic, compared to taking a limit. But there are also good reasons for the conventional wisdom: it's not obvious how to define limits to avoid inconsistency, and taking limits can require non-trivial increases in consistency strength in the underlying axioms (e.g. from "all sets are finite" to "an infinite set exists"). In any case, most of Number and Numbers consists of exegesis and commentary of the type just given, with a key role played by transitive sets, especially ordinals, also as just displayed. So it's not a hodge-podge, it's a real vision, but quite gnomic, almost a private language of Being.

On balance, Number and Numbers is a highly creative interpretation, but I think Badiou has the roles of informal mathematical narrative and proof exactly reversed. He believes, like set theorists of old, in mathematical realism. But that's not what counts in mathematics, Gödel's platonism notwithstanding. Believe what you want. What matters are new systems, logics, heuristics, conjectures, counterexamples, theorems, proofs. However you explain these is fine, but don't take mathematical metaphors too seriously, even as these are essential to understanding, communication, and teaching. In particular, the idea that ZF, or other set theories, provide "foundations" is itself a metaphor, true in part, but today far from having the ultimate status envisioned by Frege, Russell, or Gödel.

Let's conclude with a few key points. Badiou ultimately does not create his desired "immanent" ontology of number, because he does not conquer linguistic constructivism. Set theory relies on first-order logic; it isn't expressed through its own ontological language or other angelic media. Set theory is presented using recursive rules, and the "backbone" of ordinals, as well as the cumulative hierarchy of Vas, are also inductively defined through the formalism. So constructions are ubiquitous. Badiou would like to think that Conway's surreal numbers, being "constitutive" of ordinals, real numbers, and their wild arithmetic, avoids that constructivist stain. According to Badiou,

It is particularly reassuring to remark that, in the definition of reals as [surreal] Numbers, everything remains immanent … The characterization of a type of pure multiple has been substituted for [constructive] operational fictions … We have overcome the modern resistance to a unification of the concept of Number. (177)

But surreal numbers don't arise from dust, they rely on combinatorial rules via Conway's game-theoretic constructs, and these are axioms manqué. Computation and symbolic manipulation cannot be ignored because every formalism relies on them.

Anti-constructivist bias distorts Badiou's history of mathematics, in which virtually nothing happens vis à vis number after around 1900. In particular, he ignores Alan Turing and related theories of symbolic processing (Post, Church, Chomsky, et al.), from which came modern computing and its world historical consequences. Of course, Badiou detests such "constructive" thought, so he ignores its milestones, including equivalencies of many mathematical theories and computational procedures. For example, if you remove the axiom "an infinite set exists" from ZF, you essentially are left with Peano arithmetic; the two theories are interinterpretable, in fact via the "hereditarily finite" sets, the Vns, all of which are easily coded as finite sequences of natural numbers. There is also fabulous complexity, of just the kind Badiou is enamored, found right in the Peano axioms, whose computational power can be associated exactly with "exponential" ordinals ω, ωω, … , through all such finite "towers." Badiou, to his credit, begins Number and Numbers with the ancient and persistent conflict between arithmetic/computational and geometrical/ontological conceptions of number (Chapter 1), but his attempt to so marginalize the former in favor of the latter founders on what's been learned since the late 19th century.

Now recall Badiou's fundamental premise, namely the primacy of real numbers and their algebra for representing nature or other expressions of Being. It used to be assumed, as Badiou does, that to do much applied science, you needed the full real number line and its basic operations (integrals, derivatives, functional operators, etc.) as found in college physics. Hence it was thought that some infinitary set theory was needed to justify all that, in the spirit of Quine's ontological commitment. But that turns out to be false. Hermann Weyl already saw in the 1920s that much abstract mathematics could be developed using weak set-theoretical methods, sometimes called "predicative," in contrast to "impredicative", definitions implicit in many real number concepts (e.g. the "least upper bound" of infinite sets of real numbers). The question then is whether modern science really can be codified using such weak assumptions, thus greatly reducing any supposed ontological burden implied by a Quine or Badiou. Solomon Feferman, the proof theorist most critical of much modern set theory, and editor-in-chief of Gödel's Collected Works argues persuasively in In the Light of Logic (1998) that Weyl was essentially correct: very little set theory, and perhaps none of the "completed" infinite, is needed for natural science. You can study the higher infinite all you like for aesthetic or intellectual reasons, but it can't be justified by an ideology of natural scientific need. So unless Badiou has other grounds for his starting premise, the project is unstable from the start, built on the sand Weyl saw beneath the Cantorian infinite.

Finally a note on the political pretensions of this book, intended to say something about the dominance of numbers in contemporary life, themselves a polluted incarnation of Badiou's surreal Number. The topic is discussed in passing, and not convincingly. We live under "the reign of [ordinary, calculating] number" (213), which "informs our souls," "governs cultural representations" (3), and "imposes a fallacious idea of a bond between numericality and value, or truth" (213). True, numbers are an intellectual technology used for good or bad ends. But, if I want to estimate populations most impacted by AIDS and the best ways for allocating limited resources, is that domination? Or knowing the amount of concrete needed to keep schools from collapsing in earthquakes, as occurred recently in China? Just where do the problems with numbers begin? Other approaches are possible, including Ian Hacking's The Taming of Chance (1990), about the development of statistical methods during the 19th century and their institutional settings. Perhaps uncoincidentally, Hacking was strongly influenced by Foucault, as in Hacking's emphasis on how people get categorized by being counted in various ways -- as criminals, the poor, orphans, immigrants, homosexuals, etc. -- hence constructing and controlling them. Alternatively, Stephen J. Gould's The Mismeasure of Man (1981) is an earlier severe indictment of statistical methods in the context of intelligence testing and racial classification. These critical histories have nothing to do with set theory. But concerning the modern avalanche of numbers, they have fidelity to its reality and true being.