Objects and Modalities: A Study in the Semantics of Modal Logic

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Tero Tulenheimo, Objects and Modalities: A Study in the Semantics of Modal Logic, Springer, 2017, 208pp., $119.99 (hbk), ISBN 9783319531182.

Reviewed by Kohei Kishida, Dalhousie University


In this book,Tero Tulenheimo lays out a semantics of quantified modal logic, and a semantic analysis of transworld or cross-world identity of individuals in particular, that is based on Hintikka's account of individuals in modal logic. Indeed, one may say his project is to modify and implement Hintikka's semantic ideas, by reflecting upon their philosophical foundations, providing them with a fuller and detailed formalism, and demonstrating applications of this formalism to several philosophical topics, and ones surrounding intentionality in particular.

The most distinctive feature of Tulenheimo's semantics, in contrast to many semantics of quantified modal logic including the ones by Kripke and by David Lewis, is that values of variables are intensions as opposed to extensions, in the way Carnap [4] distinguishes them. Another crucial feature is that the semantics has two sorts of (intensional) objects, viz. "physical" or "physically individuated" and "intentional" or "intentionally individuated", along with two sorts of quantifiers ranging over them. Using intentional objects as well as possible worlds and accessibility relations, Tulenheimo provides semantic analyses for key concepts involved in thought, perception, and other intentional states and for expressions that ascribe intentional states to agents.

One may divide this book roughly into two parts: The primary theme of one part (Chapters 1, 2, and 5) is (a modal-logic version of) the concept of world line -- a term that Carnap [3] imported from physics to modal logic and that Hintikka [6, 7] adopted. It is a notion of individual that plays a central role in Tulenheimo's semantics. Chapter 1 introduces this concept, and reflects on its philosophical interpretation and motivation. Chapter 2 then defines a "world-line semantics", and Chapter 5 investigates several logical properties of the semantics (though some extra definitions from Chapters 3 and 4 are relevant as well). The other part (Chapters 3, 4, and 6) is focused on intentionality. Chapter 3 introduces two modes of individuating objects, viz., physical and intentional world lines, and Chapter 4 illustrates why, to model objects of intentional states, intentional objects need to be world lines. Chapter 6 demonstrates this insight further by semantically modelling the contents and objects of intentional states and relevant concepts such as objects of thought, singular thought, and intensional transitive verbs.

Let us review Tulenheimo's semantics. Generally, a semantics of quantified modal logic may be called intensional if its predication and quantification concern individuals of the type that Carnap called "individual concepts", i.e., that provides (closed) individual terms with intensions as opposed to extensions. In short, in intensional logic, values of variables are intensions. Tulenheimo's semantics belongs to this intensional style of modal logic. To lay out the basic setup of intensional modal logic in Tulenheimo's terms, it involves possible worlds, and two notions of possible objects or individuals that Tulenheimo calls local objects and world lines. Local objects are components of worlds and are world-bound, so that each of them resides in exactly one world. Tulenheimo aptly compares local objects to individuals in Lewis's counterpart theory. Yet the cross-world identity of individuals is given not by counterpart relations but by world lines. A world line is a type of individual that can manifest itself in more than one world, having different local objects in different worlds as its realizations there. It may be helpful to take an example in a temporal setting where the "worlds" are the points of time in history, and to consider individuals in a four-dimensionalist fashion: Socrates lives through different points of time, but at each point t where he is alive he has a manifestation or realization, Socrates-at-t, who resides in t and only in t. Socrates is then a world line, whereas Socrates-at-t is a local object in t. Then, while Socrates-at-t1 and Socrates-at-t2 (with t1t2) cannot be identical as local objects, they are both realizations of the same world line, Socrates; and the identity of Socrates as a world line is given by its realizations, Socrates-at-t for all t.

Regarding how to define world lines formally, Tulenheimo makes an interesting point by considering two equivalent definitions. One is to define them as (a subset of) Carnap's individual concepts, i.e. functions I that take a world w as input and may output a local object I(w) in w as the manifestation or realization of I in w. In the other definition, a world line I is a set of local objects that, for each world w, contains at most one local object in w as its realization in w, I(w). (In either definition, I may, but may not, have a realization in a given world w; so I, as a function, is generally a "partial" function.) The two definitions are mathematically equivalent for semantic purposes and Tulenheimo makes use of both -- but he advocates the latter as a new thesis: worlds and individuals are both modal unities (i.e. certain sets of local objects) and are independent of each other, so that neither type of modal unity has primacy over the other.[1]

It should be stressed that not every individual concept constitutes a world line as Tulenheimo conceives of it. World lines are supposed to embody the cross-world identity of individuals, and Tulenheimo does not think -- nor does Hintikka -- that any arbitrary way of choosing a local object from each world identifies an individual: Two local objects Socrates-at-t1 and Socrates-at-t2 (with t1t2) are cross-world identical in the sense of both being realizations of the same individual, Socrates. In contrast, although there trivially is a function f such that f(t1) is Socrates-at-t1 and f(t2) Plato-at-t2, there are presumably no individuals who manifest themselves as Socrates at t1 and as Plato at t2. In this sense we may say that Tulenheimo's world lines are "privileged" individual concepts.[2]

The semantic role of world lines thus defined is, in Carnap's terms, to provide intensions for individual variables, whereas local objects provide extensions.[3] Tulenheimo then adopts intensional predication and quantification. We can generally think of the semantics of quantified modal logic as using the satisfaction relation that reads "a formula φ(x1, . . . , xn) is true of a tuple of individuals I1, . . . , In in a world w".[4] For the individuals I1, . . . , In here, Tulenheimo takes intensional ones, i.e. world lines, as opposed to extensional, local objects. World lines help interpret the modal operators, "necessarily" and in general: since world lines live across different worlds, it makes sense to say that φ(x1, . . . , xn) is true of I1, . . . , In in w iff φ(x1, . . . , xn) is true of the same world lines I1, . . . , In in every world accessible from w. This then forces predication in general to be intensional: for instance, a unary formula φ(x) may be true in a world w of a world line I but not of another J, even if I and J are coextensive in w, realized by the same local object a = I(w) = J(w); in other words, the same local object a may satisfy the property φ(x) qua (the realization of) I but not qua J.[5] In this way, world lines play the role of individuals by occupying the individual part of the satisfaction relation. Accordingly, quantifiers are intensional, ranging over world lines. More specifically, Tulenheimo lets different worlds w have different domains of quantification 𝒥w, so that ∃yφ(x1, . . . , xn, y) is true of I1, . . . , In in w iff φ(x1, . . . , xn, y) is true of I1, . . . , In, J in w for some world line J in 𝒥w. World lines in 𝒥w are said to be available in w (since the word "exist" is preserved for the sense of being realized; see Section 1.2).

These are the basic features of Tulenheimo's semantics. In fact, they are, when formally understood, common to most intensional semantics of quantified modal logic, except maybe the features that the (intensional) individuals are a proper subset of the individual concepts, and that different worlds w have different domains of quantification 𝒥w. (I will discuss these features shortly.) At any rate, to this basic setup Tulenheimo adds a crucial feature, viz., two sorts of world lines, physical or physically individuated objects and intentional or intentionally individuated objects. They are given by two sorts of quantifiers and domains of quantification: while one sort, ∃ and 𝒫w, is for the availability (in a world w) of physical objects, the other sort, for intentional objects, in fact consists of a family, Eα and 𝒥αw for agents α, each signifying the availability (in w) to the agent α. It should be noted that a given world line may be both physical and intentional, lying in both 𝒫w and 𝒥αw. Also, Tulenheimo makes the realization and the availability of an intentional object independent of each other: a world line I may be available as an intentional object to α in w (i.e., I ∈ 𝒥αw) even if it is not realized in w -- this enables α to, e.g., think of an object, I, that does not "exist" (in the sense of being realized) in w -- and I may not be available to α in w even if it has a realization I(w) in w.

World lines, and intentional ones in particular, play an essential role in Tulenheimo's semantic analysis of concepts and expressions concerning intentional states and ascriptions thereof. Tulenheimo first argues, citing accounts by Anscombe [1] and other philosophers, that it is crucial for an intentional object to be a world line rather than a local object: e.g., an intentional object is presumably indeterminate with respect to most predicates P (the agent does not believe either it is P or it is not P), a property that a world line has but a worldbound local object does not. In Tulenheimo's approach to intentionality, probably the most crucial concept is that of content of an intentional state, defined as a pair of a set W of worlds and a tuple (possibly empty) of world lines I1, . . . , In. If the intentional state is one that an agent α has in a world w, then W is the set of worlds compatible with that state (e.g. α's belief) and Ii are intentional objects available to α in w, i.e. Ii ∈ 𝒥αw. The two kinds of components, W and Ii, help Tulenheimo accommodate two ways of characterizing intentionality that some may have thought of (as Hintikka [7] did) as incompatible: viz., intensionality is a criterion of intentionality (as Hintikka maintained) due to W, while object-directedness is another due to Ii. Tulenheimo then applies these conceptual tools to topics pertaining to intentionality, and most notably objects of thought, singular thought, and intensional verbs, by building on or criticizing recent accounts by Recanati [10], Crane [5], and Moltmann [8].

Through these applications to the philosophy of intentionality, this book demonstrates a virtue of intensional predication and quantification. I take this to also be a significant contribution to modal logic and its philosophy, in which the attention of the majority of philosophers is on extensional predication and quantification. One may then ask how specific this virtue is to the particular formalism of this book, and how common it is to intensional modal logics in general. Tulenheimo indeed refers to a list of works in the intensional camp of quantified modal logic (p. 17): some, like Tulenheimo, follow Hintikka and use the concept of world line, while others, such as Belnap and Müller [2], take advantage of formally the same idea under conceptually different makeup. The list does not refer to the tradition of research that is arguably the most influential among the intensional camp, i.e., Montague semantics, which originates from Montague's [9] intensional logic -- but this tradition is relevant, too. As I am going to show in the following, Tulenheimo's semantics, or at least its formalism, can be seen as a fragment, perhaps with some additional axioms, of the intensional logics by Belnap and Müller and by Montague; so the philosophical ideas laid out in this book can equally be expressed with these logics as well.

We should first consider one of the features that are peculiar to Tulenheimo's formalism among intensional modal logics -- viz., his truth condition for atomic formulas, which states that, although predication is generally intensional (i.e., formulas are true of world lines rather than of local objects), atomic predicates concern local objects. (Formally, every n-ary atomic predicate Q is assigned, in each world w, a set of n-tuples of local objects in w as its extension there, so that Q(x1, . . . , xn) is true of world lines I1, . . . , In in w iff the extension contains the tuple of realizations (I1(w), . . . , In(w)).) In explaining why he adopts this condition, Tulenheimo seems to suggest that the reason is more practical than philosophical: "I do not wish to suggest that unanalyzed and therefore atomic predicates for some reason must ascribe local properties. However, for my purposes in this book, it suffices to confine attention to [local atomic predication]" (p. 15); "I wish to keep my formalism relatively simple. It will always be possible to extend a well-understood formalism, while a sketchy account of a messy formalism serves no purpose" (p. 39). It seems, however, that the condition Tulenheimo adopts actually makes the formalism less simple but messier, by destroying uniformity in predication. This can be seen from Tulenheimo's own investigation of logical consequences of the condition (quite some space is devoted to studying them in Chapters 2 and 5). One consequence that I find particularly costly is that the substitution of general formulas for predicates (e.g., obtaining φ(x) → x = x from Q(x) → x = x) fails to preserve validity, thereby preventing several notions such as that of logical form from working in the standard way (these issues are addressed in Sections 5.5 and 5.6).

I would instead suggest that atomic predication should by default be intensional, just like general predication. (Every n-ary formula is assigned as its "semantic value" (Definition 2.1) a subset of pairs of an n-tuple of world lines and a world. So one should simply assign the same type of values to atomic predicates. Nothing is messy.) This would make predication uniform, and substitution would then preserve validity straightforwardly. Or, in terms of application, one can then accommodate sortal predicates (as conceived of by perdurantist four-dimensionalists), as Tulenheimo is well aware of (p. 39). In many other applications one may certainly want some (or all) atomic predicates Q to be about local objects -- in particular, the local-identity predicate "=" should be, as it is in Belnap and Müller [2] for instance -- but then they can assume the locality of Q as an additional axiom. Indeed, as long as "=" is local, the locality of any other predicate, or any formula for that matter, can be expressed in the manner of Definition 2.2.

Here is another benefit of making atomic predication intensional in Tulenheimo's framework, which involves two sorts of world lines and quantifiers. In the non-modal context, many-sorted logic has different sorts of objects and quantifiers, such as ∃(x : S) for "there is an x of sort S such that . . . ". Yet this logic can be translated into the usual single-sorted logic as a fragment: with a "sort predicate" S added to the latter for each sort S in the former, the sorted quantifier ∃(x : S) translates as ∃x(S(x) ∧ ⋯ ) in the single-sorted logic. The same idea of translation would apply to Tulenheimo's logic -- if its atomic predication were intensional as opposed to extensional or local: Let 𝒫 and 𝒥α be atomic predicates ". . . is an available physical object" and ". . . is an intentional object available to the agent α", so that 𝒫(x) is true of I in w if I ∈ 𝒫w and 𝒥α(x) is true of I in w if I ∈ 𝒥αw -- this makes 𝒫 and 𝒥α intensional. Then, letting ∃ range over all world lines, we can translate ∃x and Eαx as ∃x(𝒫(x) ∧ ⋯ ) and ∃x(𝒥α(x) ∧ ⋯ ), respectively. Indeed, we can let ∃ range over the set of all individual concepts as opposed to the subset of world lines, and let the range be the same for all worlds. (The privileged status of physical objects and intentional objects will then be expressed by the predicates 𝒫 and 𝒥α, rather than built into the logic by means of quantifiers ∃ and Eα.) This means that the semantics and logic of this book can be regarded as giving a fragment of some of the preceding intensional logics such as the one by Belnap and Müller or Montague semantics. Extra features of Tulenheimo's formalism, such as the locality of atomic predicates, the hypotheses H1 through H4 (p. 69), or that different worlds have different domains of quantification, can then be expressed as additional axioms.

This connection to preceding frameworks of intensional modal logic shows a missed opportunity. In laying out his semantics, Tulenheimo emphasizes its philosophical heritage from Hintikka, but on the formal, technical front he is concerned almost exclusively with logical properties of the particular formalism of his own. To be sure, the connection to Montague semantics or the semantics by Belnap and Müller is primarily formal: they make use of different conceptual makeup than world lines. Yet their formalism can readily be interpreted as a world-line semantics in Tulenheimo's fashion, with the help of the translation in the previous paragraph. This fact, that Tulenheimo's semantics can be seen as a fragment of preceding ones, should not be taken to diminish the value of his contribution. On the contrary, it should make his philosophical ideas even more significant, because it means that his semantic analysis of expressions concerning intentional states can now be integrated with the large body of applications to natural language semantics that have been developed in the tradition of Montague semantics. Through this integration, Tulenheimo's ideas may well lead to an even more fruitful contribution not just to modal logic and modal metaphysics, philosophy of language, and philosophy of mind, but also to the interdisciplinary study of intentionality spanning mathematical linguistics and cognitive science.


My research was supported by the Natural Sciences and Engineering Research Council of Canada (NSERC) and by the Air Force Office of Scientific Research, Air Force Material Command, USAF under Award No. FA9550-15-1-0331.


[1] E. Anscombe, "The Intentionality of Sensation: A Grammatical Feature", in R. J. Butler, ed., Analytical Philosophy: Second Series, Blackwell, 1965, pp. 158 -- 80.

[2] N. Belnap and T. Müller, "CIFOL: Case-Intensional First Order Logic", Journal of Philosophical Logic 43 (2014), 393 -- 437.

[3] R. Carnap, Der logische Aufbau der Welt, Weltkreis, 1928. Translated by R. A. George as The Logical Structure of the World, University of California Press, 1967.

[4] R. Carnap, Meaning and Necessity, University of Chicago Press, 1947.

[5] T. Crane, The Objects of Thought, Oxford University Press, 2013.

[6] K. J. J. Hintikka, "Carnap's Semantics in Retrospect", Synthese 25 (1973), 372 -- 397.

[7] K. J. J. Hintikka, The Intentions of Intentionality and Other New Models for Modalities, Springer, 1975.

[8] F. Moltmann, "Quantification with Intentional and with Intensional Verbs", in A. Torza, ed., Quantifiers, Quantifiers, and Quantifiers: Themes in Logic, Metaphysics, and Language, Springer, 2015, pp. 141 -- 68.

[9] R. Montague, "The Proper Treatment of Quantification in Ordinary English", in K. J. J. Hintikka, J. M. E. Moravcsik, and P. Suppes, eds., Approaches to Natural Language, Reidel, 1973, pp. 221 -- 242.

[10] F. Recanati, Mental Files, Oxford University Press, 2012.

[11] A. Sidelle, "Rigidity, Ontology, and Semantic Structure", Journal of Philosophy 89 (1992), 410 -- 430.

[1] In explaining his understanding of local objects and local identity among them, Tulenheimo says that, if a and b are local objects in different worlds, "then both claims 'a is identical to b' and 'a is numerically distinct from b' must be judged meaningless" (pp. 11f.). He then adds a footnote (footnote 16) in which he argues, rightly, that this understanding does not compromise the definition of a world line I as a partial function. It does, however, seem to compromise the definition of I as a set of local objects, because identity and distinctness among the elements of this set would be meaningless.

[2] See Sidelle [11] for this sense of privilege. I thank Ted Shear for the reference.

[3] The intensions of individual constants constitute individual concepts, but Tulenheimo does not require that they be world lines. Since variables take values in the set of world lines, this means that the intensions of constants c fail to be in the range of values of variables x, making Tulenheimo's logic a special kind of free logic in which one cannot derive φ(c) either from ∀xφ(x) or from the validity of φ(x).

[4] Technically, we also need such a phrase as "with I1 in place of x1, …, In in place of xn", but I omit it throughout. Also, instead of a finite tuple or assignment of individuals, it may be more common to use, as Tulenheimo does, a function that assigns individuals to all the individual variables. Yet the two styles are equivalent, as long as one makes sure in the latter style that if a variable y does not occur freely in a formula φ then it makes no difference to the interpretation of φ what individual is assigned to y.

[5] This should be contrasted to extensional predication: Suppose a is, say, both the extension of the individual constant 8 in w and the number of planets in w. Then, with extensional predication, whether to satisfy φ(x) in w or not is a property of a, so that a is necessarily greater than 7 (in w), regardless of whether it is described as 8 or as the number of planets. Probably the majority of semantics of quantified modal logic, including Kripke's and Lewis's, adopt extensional predication. Indeed, Tulenheimo adopts a truth condition for atomic formulas that makes atomic predication extensional -- I will discuss this feature shortly.