Objects: Nothing out of the Ordinary

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Daniel Z. Korman, Objects: Nothing out of the Ordinary, Oxford University Press, 2016, 251pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198732532.

Reviewed by Simon J. Evnine, University of Miami


Daniel Z. Korman defends conservatism about ordinary objects. He understands ordinary objects to include artifacts, biological organisms, and things like electrons, rocks, rivers, and planets. Conservatism contrasts with two other positions, eliminativism and permissivism. According to eliminativism, there are no ordinary objects; according to permissivism, there are ordinary objects and a whole lot of extraordinary ones too. Extraordinary objects are not things like undiscovered organisms or fundamental particles but rather monsters of philosophy -- arbitrary mereological sums and so on. (For the most part, Korman confines his attention to concrete particulars so the question of whether things like properties, propositions, and possible worlds should count as ordinary objects or philosophical monsters is unaddressed.) The book is a work of apologetics. By this I mean two things. First, it spends relatively little time arguing for the existence of ordinary objects and the non-existence of extraordinary ones. Secondly, it says very little about the nature(s) of ordinary objects. What the book does, and does very well, is three things. It maps out the conceptual territory occupied by the various positions. It offers a simple argument against eliminativism and permissivism, and suggests why some obvious responses to that argument fail. And it rebuts a handful of arguments against conservatism.

After a very brief introductory first chapter, Chapter 2 gives an initial presentation of the main arguments against conservatism. These are the debunking arguments (we have no reason to think our beliefs about what exists are reliable); arbitrariness arguments (there are no non-arbitrary differences between ordinary objects and others); arguments from vagueness (if some pluralities compose objects and some don't, there will be unacceptable vagueness); overdetermination arguments (ordinary objects cannot cause anything their parts do not); the problem of material constitution (ordinary objects will be unacceptably co-located with their matter or parts); and the problem of the many (ordinary objects will come with a plethora of other objects that differ from them in minute ways). Chapter 3 outlines the various positions: permissivism, eliminativism, and conservatism. Chapter 4, a key chapter, presents a simple argument against permissivism and eliminativism. The argument is that they are subject to counterexamples. Eliminativism says there are no tables, but there are. Permissivism says there are trogs (things that have arbitrary dogs and trees as parts), but there are not. The argument is defended from the charge that it is question-begging and this leads Korman to examine the role of intuition since the counterexamples are sustained by intuitions. He does not, however, in keeping with the apologetic nature of the work, provide any particular theory of intuition. He merely argues that some theory or other of the phenomenon could non-question-beggingly support the counterexamples. Chapter 5 examines, and rejects, strategies for accepting the counterexamples while maintaining the theories they are supposed to lead us to reject. These are compatibilist strategies. Chapter 6 discusses another compatibilist strategy that is revolutionary rather than hermeneutic: it examines whether the introduction of a specialized language, Ontologese, could render counterexamples and extreme theories consistent. This strategy, too, is rejected. Six chapters follow in which each of the arguments against conservatism (debunking, arbitrariness, etc.) are addressed and disarmed. A brief conclusion finishes the book. (I should add that each of the chapters is accompanied by a delightful, specially made drawing by Dana Zemack.)

Defenses of conservatism are, perhaps surprisingly, quite rare in philosophy today. Conservatism is, as Korman's book brings out very well, constantly fighting on two fronts. It joins a fairly large cohort of opponents of eliminativism, but many of its allies in that fight are, we might say, friends of ordinary objects among others. Even a book like Amie Thomasson's Ordinary Objects, directed at precisely the kinds of eliminativist arguments that Korman opposes, is not a defense of conservatism since it embraces both ordinary and extraordinary objects. At the same time, the many philosophers alarmed at the plethora of extraordinary objects accepted by the permissivist often oppose it in the name of a pared down, radical view of what exists that leaves ordinary objects stranded on the far bank. As is so often the case with these things, the two extreme positions, permissivism and eliminativism, seem closer in spirit to each other than either does to the non-extreme intermediary position of conservatism with which it shares either the commitment to ordinary objects or the rejection of extraordinary ones. Through this treacherous landscape, conservatism must find a narrow path and anyone sympathetic to the view will be impressed by, and grateful for, Korman's dialectical skills.

It is rare to find a book (especially, though not only, if it is written by someone other than oneself) with almost every sentence of which one is in agreement. But (being more or less a conservative myself) this is, in fact, the situation I find myself in with Korman's book! Nevertheless, the apologetic character of the work, including the fact that it does not attempt to say anything systematic about the nature(s) of ordinary objects, means that I sometimes found myself feeling that some of the deepest issues had not been fully broached and that the array of arguments, responses, and counter-arguments was obscuring more important philosophical questions. Suppose we have a list of possibly instantiated kinds: dogs, trogs, cars, incars (like cars, but essentially inside a garage), and so on. Let us agree, as Korman argues, that intuition can provide justification for a commitment to dogs and cars and a rejection of trogs and incars. We now have our counterexamples to eliminativism and permissivism. And we can go on to give the kinds of rebuttals to the arguments against conservatism that Korman provides so well. But this does not, by itself, add up to a general understanding of why it is that the conservative is committed to these objects and not those. Nor, correlatively, does it tell us what the extreme positions are missing, beyond the details of their ontological commitments.

So, conservatism should not be just a commitment to the existence of a motley collection of ordinary objects, and a rejection of extraordinary ones. It should also include an appreciation of the fact that ordinary objects belong to higher-order kinds that are themselves ontologically significant for understanding the first-order commitments of the view. In other words, which kinds of ordinary objects there are is also something conservatism should have something to say about. My own inclination is to divide the field of ordinary objects into two such higher-order kinds: biological organisms and artifacts. My one substantive point of disagreement with Korman is over the existence of ordinary objects of a third kind, what I call natural non-organic objects (electrons, rivers, planets, etc.). He, a truer conservative than I, takes such things to exist; I am an eliminativist about them. But the point I am making here is that this disagreement, however it should be resolved, does not really have any way of appearing in Korman's treatment, which does not give any role to higher-order kinds of ordinary objects.

The one exception to this charge comes, as one might expect, in the discussion of the arguments from arbitrariness against ordinary objects. These arguments, like the others against conservatism, can function as arguments for eliminativism or for permissivism, depending on whether one takes the modus ponens or modus tollens version. The concern over arbitrariness is expressed by principles that generalize to:

Since there is no significant ontological difference between ordinary and extraordinary objects, if there are ordinary objects, then there are extraordinary ones.

Permissivists then argue from the existence of ordinary objects to the existence of the extraordinary ones, eliminativists from the non-existence of the extraordinary to the non-existence of the ordinary. One famous version of this argument is given by Peter van Inwagen. Gollyswoggles are bits of clay that have some particular arbitrary shape (are gollyswoggle-shaped) essentially. Van Inwagen holds that if statues are made by sculptors, then gollyswoggles are made by people idly molding bits of clay. There is, using Korman's language, no non-arbitrary difference between statues and gollyswoggles. Since van Inwagen does not accept the existence of gollyswoggles, he rejects the existence of statues and, with them, all artifacts. Korman responds to this argument incisively and, in my opinion, wholly correctly by pointing out that there is a non-arbitrary difference between gollyswoggles and statues in that the latter are, essentially, the products of intentional making. Thus a sculptor's activity in bringing into existence a statue is quite different from what an idle fiddler with a piece of clay does to make it gollyswoggle-shaped. (Nor, of course, as Korman points out, does making the clay gollyswoggle-shaped entail making it so essentially.) But while the response to van Inwagen is entirely right, the appeal to special features of artifacts does not appear here as part of a general conservative treatment of the kinds of ordinary objects there are, and how these kinds can, if seen broadly, underpin a more general rebuttal of the arguments against the existence of ordinary objects or for the existence of extraordinary ones. The appeal appears only because van Inwagen's argument happens not to be a general eliminativist argument against ordinary objects at all but a bit of special pleading against artifacts.

Notwithstanding a possible sense of missed opportunity for a deeper investigation of conservatism, this book is highly recommended. This is because it engages with a wide range of contemporary literature on the topics it deals with, and because it gives such a good overview of the different positions and arguments involved. On top of this, it is very engagingly written. Korman has a knack for presenting complex positions and arguments clearly and directly. The book will be very useful to those who may not already be passionate about one or another of these positions but wants to get some of idea of what is going on in one large corner of contemporary analytic metaphysics. And it will be really invaluable to anyone already in this corner.