Objects of Metaphor

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Samuel Guttenplan, Objects of Metaphor, Oxford University Press, 2005, 305pp., $35.00 (pbk), ISBN 0199280894.

Reviewed by Catherine Wearing, Wellesley College


Objects of Metaphor is an ambitious book. Guttenplan's goal is to present an account of metaphor that, on the one hand, treats the full range of metaphor-related puzzles, including metaphors of diverse grammatical structures, dead metaphors, mixed metaphors, and the relation of metaphor to other figurative tropes and to simile, while on the other hand harmonizing with our other, more general, commitments about meaning and language. For anyone interested in metaphor, this book is a must-read. But Objects of Metaphor (hereafter 'OM') will be of interest to philosophers of language more generally, for Guttenplan's account of metaphor rests on a thought-provoking revision of our general ideas about predication. The ramifications of this revision for language use beyond metaphor are well worth exploring.

Chapter One introduces three claims about metaphor that Guttenplan takes to constrain any satisfactory account. The positive account, however, begins by stepping back from metaphor to re-examine our general ideas about predication. The arguments for the proposed revision, which are independent of any considerations to do with metaphor, occupy Chapter Two. With these resources in hand, Guttenplan develops what he calls the Semantic Descent account of metaphor, first in a rather minimalist form for a limited set of examples (Chapter Three), and then in more detail for a wide range of metaphorical and related cases (a lengthy Chapter Four). The final chapter concludes by considering the Semantic Descent account in relation to several competing proposals. In what follows here, I'll adopt Guttenplan's order of presentation, introducing the three constraints, the general readjustment of predication, and finally the Semantic Descent account. I'll close with a pair of questions about the account.

The first constraint on any explanation of metaphor concerns truth: metaphorical content seems to be truth-evaluable, and it seems to be what is asserted by the person who utters the metaphor. As Guttenplan observes,

when Romeo says that Juliet is the sun, he is offering us some content, genuinely assertoric in force, something with which it makes sense to agree or disagree in the ordinary truth-directed way. (pg. 15)

There are, of course, cases in which this is not so -- certain poetic contexts, perhaps, in which nothing is being asserted and truth is beside the point -- but there are any number of perfectly ordinary cases in which it is so, and this is what requires explanation.

The second constraint concerns paraphrase: Guttenplan insists that paraphrasing a metaphor is not merely difficult or impossible, ideas that have received considerable attention in the literature; rather, it is 'outright inappropriate'. This constraint relies on employing a 'strict' sense of paraphrase -- "restating the sense of the passage in other words" (pg. 18) -- for Guttenplan allows that we can elucidate or explain what a metaphor means. These other forms of clarification are perfectly in order; it is only the demand for restatement that is inappropriate.

As for the third constraint: metaphors are transparent. Just as we automatically hear the sentences of a language we understand as meaningful rather than as stray bits of noise, we tend to understand metaphors in an immediate or direct way. We typically grasp a metaphor's (metaphorical) content without noticing its literal meaning or even that it is a metaphor. As Guttenplan is careful to point out, this is not a claim about how we comprehend metaphors from a psycholinguistic point of view: "transparency is a claim about how metaphors strike us, not about how fast they do so" (pg. 23). As a claim about our experience, however, it places an important constraint on any adequate account.

Taken together, these constraints demand that metaphorical content be truth-evaluable and assertible, but neither too directly nor too indirectly associated with the words of the metaphor themselves. What kind of account can hope to satisfy these demands? Guttenplan argues that many of the best-known accounts of metaphor fail to meet at least one of them. Davidson's account fails utterly to respect the demand that metaphors have a (non-literal) truth-evaluable content. What Guttenplan calls 'Alternative Message' accounts such as John Searle's, which take a sentence's literal meaning to be replaced by a metaphorical meaning (in virtue of, for example, the inappropriateness of the former), fail with respect to both paraphrase and transparency. Typically, such accounts take paraphrase to be possible, but difficult, and make the experience of transparency entirely mysterious. Similarly, at least some 'Content Sufficient' accounts (e.g. Max Black's), accounts which associate metaphorical content quite directly with the metaphor, also run into difficulties with paraphrase and transparency, by associating metaphorical content too closely with the metaphor's words. But a Content Sufficient account is the only type that Guttenplan thinks has a hope of ultimately accommodating all three truths, so this is what he aims to develop.

Making room for such an account requires re-thinking our more general view of language, and specifically, our understanding of predication. According to the standard picture, reference and predication are importantly complementary processes. To make an assertion, it must be clear what is being spoken about (reference), and something must be said about that thing (predication). In language, subjects and predicates jointly form a 'basic combination' capable of performing these functions. Guttenplan's worry is that philosophers of logic and language have distorted what should be the equal partnership of these two functions, giving disproportionate weight to reference and underestimating the range of predication. In particular, he is concerned about the asymmetry between the two with respect to the possibility of non-linguistic devices performing these functions. It's clear that ordinary non-linguistic objects can be used referentially (as when a handy salt cellar acts as my car while I explain a recent accident), but the general consensus seems to be that only linguistic items can act 'predicationally'. This is what Guttenplan wants to resist. Instead, he argues for a notion of qualification -- related to linguistic predication but constituting a superordinate category -- such that non-linguistic objects can be used to qualify, just as they are to refer.

An example may make the idea of qualification by an object more concrete: "imagine being shown a scene of a deserted beach, fringed by palm trees, where golden sands meet a turquoise sea, under a cloudless sky. Imagine further that in the immediate foreground of the scene -- at its very focus -- is a rubbish bin containing dozens of wristwatches." (pg. 67). In this situation, the rubbish bin full of watches qualifies -- tells us something about -- 'what life is like in that place'. Words could have been used to perform this task, but as it happens, the task of providing information about the object in question is accomplished non-linguistically. Guttenplan argues that a definite content is expressed, but not because objects have meanings in any robust sense. Instead, background information about the object doing the qualifying, together with information about the context at hand, provide the constraints necessary to determine the qualification's content.

This notion of qualification, taken as being on a par with a sense of 'reference' broad enough to include the referential use of non-linguistic objects, provides the key to the account of metaphor. All that is needed is a mechanism to bring it into play in metaphorical cases, which Guttenplan calls 'semantic descent'. Just as Quine's notion of semantic ascent moves from a sentence about the world to a (meta-linguistic) sentence about the truth of that sentence about the world, semantic descent takes us from a bit of language about the world (of typically less than sentence-size) to the very 'sub-linguistic' object or event or state of affairs that bit of language typically (or proto-typically) picks out. Via semantic descent, we move from an ordinary predicate (e.g. 'is the sun') to a proto-predicate, a hybrid composed of words and objects (e.g. 'is the ¯sun¯' -- the pair of down arrows indicates semantic descent to an object), and the object in this proto-predicate (the sun) then qualifies the subject of the metaphor, Juliet.[1] In this way, something is asserted of Juliet, just as the bin of watches tells us something about life in the tropical paradise. Note that in the metaphorical case, however, both semantic descent and qualification are needed, because the starting point for a metaphor is always a string of words. As in any instance of qualification by an object, though, non-linguistic background and contextual information play a crucial role in fixing the metaphor's content.

Notice how neatly this account meets the three initial constraints. First, the product of semantic descent and qualification precisely is a truth-evaluable, assertible, content. Using an object to qualify the metaphor's subject is thereby to say something about that subject. Because this is accomplished, not with a linguistic predicate, but with a 'hybrid' predicate of object and words, paraphrase is inappropriate. One cannot say 'in other words' what has not been said in words in the first place, so the second constraint is also observed. Finally, the demand for transparency is met in virtue of the fact that semantic descent proceeds from particular words, rather than from the literal interpretation of the metaphorical sentence as a whole. The literal meaning of the sentence is not required to play any intermediate role; instead, metaphorical content is produced directly via semantic descent and qualification.

This very quick sketch of the Semantic Descent account naturally leaves many questions unanswered. I have said nothing about Guttenplan's application of the account to the wide range of related topics such as dead metaphors and the other tropes. These discussions constitute some of the richest material in the book, providing a satisfyingly unified picture of these phenomena. Regarding the general account, however, questions remain. For example, it's unclear that paraphrasing metaphors is indeed inappropriate, a claim that contributes to eliminating a number of competing accounts from consideration. Certainly, one's particular account might dictate that paraphrase be inappropriate. If, as Davidson famously insisted, metaphors were like photographs, there would be something odd about attempting to paraphrase a metaphor in the same way that paraphrasing a photograph makes no sense. In a similar way, the Semantic Descent account's use of 'hybrid' predicates implies that paraphrase is inappropriate. But this doesn't establish that the inappropriateness of paraphrase is a pre-theoretical constraint. Guttenplan fails to make clear why a 'strict' sense of paraphrase should imply inappropriateness, rather than just difficulty. As a result, defenders of accounts that violate this second constraint (such as Searle or Black) might well demand further argument before abandoning their positions.

With respect to the Semantic Descent account itself, one might worry about qualification's capacity to deliver a sufficiently determinate content. In contrast to cases of reference using objects, in which the object simply needs to get us to the intended referent, qualification by an object has to deliver information sufficiently determinate to be truth-evaluable (and yet incapable of being stated in words). Objects, unlike words, are not 'built' for this task. We may know all sorts of things about a given object, of course, but it's not clear that sorting through our associations in a given context leads to a stable content. Nor is it clear what principles guide this sorting. In this connection, Guttenplan simultaneously plays down the substance of words' contributions to content while emphasizing the extent to which we tend to share ways of thinking about the objects that are used for qualification. But this response depends on blurring the line between linguistic and non-linguistic abilities in a way that requires more defense than it receives in OM.

This leads to a final, more general, issue. One striking feature of Objects of Metaphor is Guttenplan's insistence throughout that he is giving a philosophical account of metaphor, not an account of how we actually process metaphors when we hear them. Thus, the claim is not that mental processes of semantic descent and qualification are being carried out by hearers; instead,

the semantic descent account attempts to characterize metaphors in such as way as to make their intelligibility possible: the thought is: were we to allow descent from 'infant' to a determinate individual, and were we to imagine this individual taking on a role usually played by a predicate -- a role … called 'qualification' -- then we could make sense of ['Tolstoy is an infant']. (pg. 112)

And yet this is intended to be an account of metaphor that explains "how metaphor fits into the study of linguistic meaning generally" (pg. 3). If one takes the study of linguistic meaning (and philosophy of language generally) to be importantly continuous with both linguistics and psychology, the question arises as to what the status of semantic descent and qualification really is, and how the Semantic Descent account relates to the actual comprehension of metaphorical language. Qualification seems to extend our semantic abilities beyond language, which raises potential points of contact with more empirically based investigations of semantic abilities outside (or in the absence of) the language faculty. It is frustrating in this connection that Guttenplan does not discuss the relevance-theoretic account of metaphor (cf. Sperber and Wilson (1995); Carston (2002)), which aims to develop an empirically viable explanation that is sensitive to the very constraints that Guttenplan imposes.

So there is much scope for further work here. Objects of Metaphor presents an extremely helpful framework for thinking about what one needs to have understood to have grasped a metaphor. At the same time, it opens up a range of further questions about the nature and place of the semantic abilities of reference and predication in our cognitive economy.


Carston, R. (2002) Thought and Utterances. Oxford: Blackwell.

Sperber, D. & D. Wilson. (1995) Relevance. Oxford: Blackwell.

Stern, J. (2000) Metaphor in Context. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.

[1] Guttenplan discusses at length how the Semantic Descent account works for metaphors of diverse syntactic structures, so the subject-predicate form of this example is not essential to the general explanation.