Observations upon Experimental Philosophy

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Cavendish, Margaret, Observations upon Experimental Philosophy, edited by Eileen O'Neill, Cambridge University Press, 2001, 338pp, $22.00 (pbk), ISBN 0-521-77675-9.

Reviewed by Karen Detlefsen, University of Pennsylvania


During her lifetime, Margaret Cavendish (c. 1623-1673) wrote and published thirteen books, over half of which were concerned with philosophy. Her first book, Poems, and Fancies (1653) says much about Cavendish as a thinker and writer. These are, indeed, poems, and through them, Cavendish presents her early thoughts on philosophy of nature – a kind of atomism in keeping with the approach of many mechanical philosophers of the time. The book is telling because of Cavendish’s experiments with genre together with her subject matter; throughout her life, she would remain interested in natural philosophy, and she would present her thoughts in the form of poems, plays, a ‘correspondence’ between Cavendish and a fictional woman, as well as ‘typical’ philosophical discourses. But while her experiments with genre and her interest in philosophy would remain, the specifics of her natural philosophy would soon change. Her mature views are found in a number of long and rich treatises, including her Observations upon Experimental Philosophy (hereafter Observations), first published in 1666 with the second edition appearing in 1668. It is a fascinating book—especially for those interested in either the history of early modern philosophy or the history of women in philosophy – not only for the breadth of topics Cavendish covers, but also because the book exemplifies two important recent trends in history of philosophy: it shows the continuing impact of ancient thought upon the early modern period, and it is an example of the overdue recognition of a text written by a long-marginalized figure.

With few exceptions, until the last decade or two, Cavendish and her work were dismissed and often mocked. The spirit of Virginia Woolf’s assessment is not unusual: “She has the irresponsibility of a child and the arrogance of a Duchess…. There is something noble and Quixotic and high-spirited, as well as crack-brained and bird-witted, about her”.1 Indicative of Cavendish’s attitude toward herself and of other people’s reaction to her was her manner of dress. Insistent upon cultivating originality in all her endeavors (“I always took delight in a singularity, even in accoutrements of habits”), Cavendish designed her own clothing. The promise of a glance at these unique creations would draw crowds when she passed by in a carriage. And it was not just her appearance that evoked ridicule; the idea of Cavendish-as-spectacle was pervasive, and extended to her written work as well. But as Eileen O’Neill points out, in her superb introduction to Cavendish’s Observations, this trend has thankfully begun to abate. Recent reaction has been to actually study the ideas contained in her work, and this study has paid off with recognition that Cavendish is trying to erect a comprehensive and systematic philosophy of nature that will avoid some of the pitfall of her contemporaries’ systems without also falling prey to the problems in Aristotelian philosophy that those contemporaries were trying to avoid in the first place. Whether or not she is successful in erecting a radically original philosophy of nature (as she claims), and whether or not she is successful in avoiding the pitfalls she sees in her contemporaries’ work without falling into other pitfalls equally as troublesome, are questions that require close study. But at least these sorts of questions are now being studied.2

O’Neill’s introduction, a concise 27 pages covering considerable terrain (there are also several helpful pages that provide a chronology and lists of primary and secondary texts), starts by providing the reader with much of the context necessary to make sense of Cavendish’s project (x-xv). Cavendish rejects Cartesianism in part because of its untenable dualism, its adherence to immaterial substance (which Cavendish reserves for the supernatural realm [253]), and its claim that inert matter is moved by external motion transferred from body to body (which Cavendish rejects partly because motion as a mode cannot transfer from substance to substance [74-5]). But at the same time, she resists many of the alternatives offered in the seventeenth century. Gassendi’s Epicurean atomism is rejected after her early dabbling in that direction – matter is extended and can always be divided, and so there are no natural minima (125-31). And she rejects the ‘vitalist’ solution of Henry More who relies upon an immaterial active principle manipulating passive matter; no less than Descartes’ philosophy, this posits an unacceptable Platonic dualism that is further unsatisfactory because it posits that the incorporeal acts upon the corporeal to explain every natural event. Cavendish is in the materialist camp, but she espouses a very unusual form of materialism, which O’Neill elsewhere calls “organic materialism”.3 Cavendish claims that her particular form of materialism separates her off from Hobbes, a claim she argues for at length in her 1664 Philosophical Letters. If there is a single characterization that appears over and over again in the secondary literature on Cavendish, it is that she rejects mechanism and instead accepts a peculiar form of material vitalism.4

These terms are troublesome, not least of all because there are so many ways of understanding mechanism and vitalism that it is hardly clarifying to label a thinker’s philosophy of nature with either term. This point is established by the fact that both More and Johannes Baptista Van Helmont – two other thinkers Cavendish repudiates in her Philosophical Letters – propose theories of nature also dubbed “vitalist”. More useful is O’Neill’s characterization of Cavendish’s philosophy as inspired by the Stoics. O’Neill’s investigations establish that Cavendish was familiar with Chrysippus’ work (xxii). Cavendish’s own acknowledgment (249) that she read Thomas Stanley’s The History of Philosophy, which includes material on Stoicism, further helps to establish the fact that she would have been aware of this precedent. But as O’Neill points out (xv), Cavendish fails to discuss Stoicism in the third and final part of her Observations – “Observations Upon the Opinions of Some Ancient Philosophers” – where she differentiates her philosophy from that of many of the ancients, and perhaps the reason for this omission is her fear of undermining her own claim that, unlike her contemporaries, she does not borrow from any other philosophy to build her own (250).

Among the features of Stoicism that make their way into Cavendish’s mature philosophy are the following three. First, the natural world is wholly material, and given that there are no vacua in nature (78-9), nature is a unified whole that is further self-moving (47-8; 70-4; 208ff). This explains O’Neill’s label of Cavendish’s system as organic materialism – nature is a self-moving unity, much like an organism in which parts serve the whole and must be defined in terms of the whole. Second, matter is not only self-moving, but every part of matter senses and reasons in some degree. In fact, Cavendish identifies two degrees of matter – animate and inanimate (211). She further differentiates two forms of knowledge that animate matter has – rational and sensitive knowledge (23-4). This is not to say that any given part of matter we may isolate is one of these three types, for Cavendish believes any part of matter we may isolate, no matter how small, will include both inanimate and animate elements, as well as reasoning and sensing parts (206). She is careful to note that there are many different forms of sensing and reasoning, and so humans should not take their form as the only possibility (218ff). For these reasons, O’Neill cites “complete blending” of degrees of matter (xxiv-xxv), pan-psychism and pan-organicism (xxv) as three other key features of Cavendish’s mature philosophy of nature. Third, causation is explained through a kind of sympathy or affinity of parts within a whole, as opposed to external motion transferred from substance to substance (139-44).5 Matter is essentially moving, and motion as a mode is essentially connected with a substance. Any theory of causation dependent upon the transfer of motion model will, in Cavendish’s evaluation, fail to explain these basic metaphysical principles.

The inherently moving matter which can also regulate itself (because it senses and reasons) lends nature an extreme independence, and indeed, Cavendish posits that the natural world has existed eternally and is infinite (32; 73). This has led some to suggest that she skirted dangerously close to atheism – or actually crossed into that camp.6 After all, it is true that Cavendish attributes all natural effects to the self-regulating corporeal whole that is nature itself. There is no clear role for God in her natural philosophy – neither in the maintenance nor in the creation of nature (208-12). Further, human ‘souls’ are the imaginative and arrogant creation of none other than humans who want to separate themselves (erroneously) from the nature of which they are a mere part.7 This points to an extreme egalitarianism in Cavendish’s conception of natural beings; human dominance over other creatures is wrong because humans and every other being in the world are made from the same material (66-7). Not surprisingly, then, one of her poems advocates vegetarianism and a cessation to hunting:

As if that God made Creatures for Mans meat, To give them Life, and Sense, for Man to eat; Or else for Sport, or Recreations sake, Destroy those Lifes that God saw fit to make…8

But to brand Cavendish an atheist does not square with her own words. She acknowledges the existence of God; but she also acknowledges the fact that human reason cannot perfectly grasp God’s nature given that God is an infinite whole belonging to the supernatural realm while humans (and our reason) are finite parts of nature. Quite in contrast with the charge of atheism, Cavendish believes that all of nature knows that God exists (even if no part knows perfectly what God is or how he operates) because all of nature has a share of reason (216).

This relation between God and the natural world, and Cavendish’s theory of causation, together lead to one of the most interesting elements of her natural philosophy, but also to one of the most troublesome elements of that philosophy because it indicates one of the weakest points in it. This is her theory of naturalistic occasionalism – an occasionalism without God. In brief, there is no direct interaction between a cause and an effect. The cause is merely the occasion for the effect to occur, but the effect comes about from within the individual body affected; this accords with her views on the self-motion of material beings and the impossibility of the transfer of motion from body to body (168-83; O’Neill has an exceptionally clear, detailed, and historically nuanced account of this theory in her introduction [xxix-xxxv]). But unlike Malebranche, for example, who allows God a mediating role, Cavendish allocates no such role for a supernatural being in her philosophy. And unlike Leibniz, for example, who allows that God pre-established order and harmony among individuals that in no way interact, Cavendish’s belief in an eternally-persisting nature with no divine creation of it precludes this solution as well. Thus, although there is no direct interaction between bodies in nature, and although there is no mediation through an extra-natural being, bodies in nature nonetheless seem to interact harmoniously, and they do so with a regularity that demands an explanation.

Cavendish’s answer is both ultimately unsatisfactory and historically exciting. She appeals to the sympathy or affinity among parts within a whole (139-44). When one individual body within nature acts as an occasional cause, another individual body within nature “patterns out” the appropriate effect. That is, it senses or reasons from within its own being, exactly the appropriate ‘reaction’ for the ‘cause’ sensed or reasoned from within the being of the occasional cause. The reason why this is unsatisfactory is that she still needs to explain why one distinct body has the right kind of affinity for exactly the right body at the right time so as to bring about the proper cause-effect relationship between the two individual bodies that we undoubtedly witness. That is, she needs to explain the harmony and order – the apparent interaction among unconnected individual parts – that Malebranche and Leibniz can explain only by appealing to God.

What is historically exciting about her answer is that she presages, albeit somewhat vaguely, the solution that Spinoza will offer, and this places her squarely in the mainstream story of early modern metaphysics. As Spinoza will argue, there are no individual bodies; there are no unconnected parts, but only the whole and its modes. This monistic solution to the general problem of causation is implicit in many of Cavendish’s doctrines (that Spinoza’s deep debt to Stoicism is also often recognized strengthens this connection between Cavendish and Spinoza). This potential solution is, however, undermined by Cavendish’s desire to reserve a place for particular bodies within a whole (31; 188). That is, if one billiard ball’s hitting another is considered the cause of an effect in the second ball, then there has to be some way of identifying and separating these two individual balls – and Cavendish would seem to have to assume that there are two individuals or particular bodies in this case. But then the problem arises again of how to account for the special sympathy or affinity between the two. And there is the deeper problem of how to account for individuals at all within a theory of a material plenum that can be divided in numerous ways – even within ‘one’ billiard ball there are many material parts that presumably cannot interact directly with each other in order to cohere as one. Or if they cohere, then they do so via sympathy, and the problem arises again, this time within an object. In short, it seems Cavendish will have to choose between starting with the parts (particulars, individuals), in which case she maintains individuals but then she has the problem of interaction; or starting with the whole, in which case she can solve the interaction problem by simple denying it altogether (there is no interaction between bodies because there is just one body) but then she has the problem of how to account for individuals. Cavendish seems to tend toward the latter option.

This is not to say that Cavendish cannot answer these, and other, difficulties. The Observations is just one of several books in which she presents her mature philosophy of nature. Further, it is the book meant to challenge a particular group of contemporaries – those experimentalists (such as Boyle, Hooke, and Powers) who turn to empirical investigations, aided by the telescope and the microscope, of the natural world in order to elucidate aspects of it. Cavendish is an unabashed speculative philosopher. Reason, and not sense (not even sense aided by the artifice of microscopes and telescopes), she insists, will lead us to the “interior” truths of the natural world (46-53).

So the Observations provides us with just one example of Cavendish’s philosophy of nature, and one with very particular aims. A proper study of Cavendish’s work would require a close reading of her other books as well, especially her Letters (in which she sets her philosophy against that of her fellow seventeenth-century rationalists speculators), and her Grounds of Natural Philosophy (1668), in which she attempts a more systematic presentation of her views. This only goes to suggest that O’Neill’s edition of the Observations is a prime example of what we need more of: the recovery of and easy access to texts too-long forgotten and languishing in rare book rooms.


1. Virginia Woolf. The Duchess of Newcastle. In The Common Reader. London: Hogarth Press, 1925: 74, 78.

2. See, for example, Stephen Clucas. The Atomism of the Cavendish Circle: A Reappraisal. The Seventeenth Century. 9 (2), 1994: 247-273; Sarah Hutton. In Dialogue with Thomas Hobbes: Margaret Cavendish’s natural philosophy. Women’s Writing. 4 (3), 1997: 421-432; Susan James. The Philosophical Innovations of Margaret Cavendish. British Journal for the History of Philosophy. 7 (2), 1999: 219-244; and John Rogers. Margaret Cavendish and the Gendering of the Vitalist Utopia. In The Matter of Revolution: Science, Poetry, and Politics in the Age of Milton. Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 1996: chapter 6.

3. Eileen O’Neill. Margaret Lucas Cavendish. In The Routledge Encyclopedia of Philosophy. New York: Routledge Press, 1998: 260.

4. See, for example, James op. cit.: 229; and Hutton op. cit.: 422.

5. These three Stoic elements are identified in O’Neill, op. cit.: 261

6. See, for example, Londa Schiebinger. Margaret Cavendish, Duchess of Newcastle. In A History of Women Philosophers, vol. 3. Edited by Mary Ellen Waithe. Dordrecht: Kluwer Academic Publishers, 1991: 7; and Robert Hugh Kargon. Atomism in England from Hariot to Newton. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1966, 75.

7. See Margaret Atherton. Introduction to Margaret Cavendish. In Women Philosophers of the Early Modern Period. Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing Company, 1994: 23.

8. Margaret Cavendish. “The Hunting of the hare”. In Poems, and Fancies. London, 1653: 112.