Social Ontology and Collective Intentionality: Critical Essays on the Philosophy of Raimo Tuomela with His Responses

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Gerhard Preyer and Georg Peter (eds.), Social Ontology and Collective Intentionality: Critical Essays on the Philosophy of Raimo Tuomela with His Responses, Springer, 2017, 220pp., $99.00 (hbk), ISBN 9783319332352.

Reviewed by Olle Blomberg, Lund University


For more than 30 years, Raimo Tuomela has been doing groundbreaking research on the nature of social action and collective intentionality (collective belief, collective intention, etc.), and social ontology (the nature of social groups, institutions, etc.). This collection contains eight essays in which nine male philosophers interpret, criticise, develop, or take inspiration from this research. They focus on Tuomela’s latest book, Social Ontology: Collective Intentionality and Group Agents (2013). Each essay is followed by a response by Tuomela.


Overall, the essays are of good quality and the book is highly recommended to those interested in Tuomela’s important and influential work on collective intentionality and social ontology. In general, his responses are clarifying, although in my view, he occasionally puts too much emphasis on correcting what he sees as misinterpretations of his work (the corrections are sometimes important, but not always).


The essays by Michael Schmitz, Hans Bernard Schmid, Raul Hakli and Pekka Mäkelä, and Martin Rechenauer are relatively freestanding. Those by Kirk Ludwig, David P. Schweikard, Arto Laitinen, and Frank Hindriks deal to a large extent with interpretative issues and arguments related to Tuomela’s Social Ontology. The editors’ introduction contains a brief presentation of that book (and not much else), but it will not help the uninitiated. The collection is thus primarily aimed at those already familiar with the field and some of Tuomela’s work. In the following, I highlight the main thematic connections among the essays.


One theme is the ontological status of social reality, and, in particular, of group agents. According to Tuomela, if group members view the group they belong to as an intentional agent (think of the employees at a small firm), then they can collectively construct it as such. Such a group agent is a real causal-functional system, but its intentions and beliefs are not intrinsically intentional; there is no group-level phenomenal consciousness. The group members attribute the attitudes to the causal-functional system, and thereby make them extrinsically intentional. However, the participating members’ so-called “we-attitudes” are nevertheless derived from, and ontologically depend on, these attitudes attributed to the group. A group attitude thus cannot be reductively decomposed into we-attitudes. Tuomela  takes all this to imply that the group agent and its attitudes are at the same time real in a causal-functional sense and partly (as he puts it) “fictitious.” In some places, he claims that the latter implies that the group agent and its attitudes are not real, in the sense that they lack intrinsic intentionality.


Laitinen, Hindriks, and Schmitz each argue either that this picture of group agents is too individualistic, contains unnecessary elements of “irrealism” or “eliminativism,” or is unstable. For example, Hindriks argues that the distinction between intrinsic and extrinsic rationality that Tuomela’s account of group agents rests on is problematic, and that a functionalist view of the mind implies that group agents have real intentional states (p. 201). Laitinen also raises questions about the consequences that Tuomela’s view might have for the ontology of rights and responsibilities of group agents. In response, Tuomela rejects all three authors’ construal of his position and argues that he has been misinterpreted.


What Tuomela is aiming for, I think, is a view of the following sort: while it is an essential property of intentional states that they are potentially phenomenally conscious, this property isn’t essential for the roles these states play in psychological explanations and, perhaps, in grounding attributions of moral responsibility. Hence, groups may have causal-functional analogues of intentional states — of which Tuomela gives sophisticated accounts — that can support psychological explanations of group action and attributions of moral responsibility to groups, even if these analogues aren’t group intentional states. At any rate, I think that all three authors highlight interesting and problematic tensions in Tuomela’s work.


There is also an interesting exchange between Hindriks and Tuomela on the ontology of institutions such as marriage and money. Hindriks shares Tuomela’s view that institutions are norm-governed social practices, but they emphasise different ways in which institutions can enable new forms of actions for individuals and groups. Tuomela focuses exclusively on the role of collectively accepted constitutive rules, whereas Hindriks focuses on how collectively accepted regulative rules facilitate coordination and cooperation. According to Hindriks, regulative rules can create new types of actions, and constitutive rules sometimes only make these new action possibilities explicit by introducing linguistic terms for referring to them. Hindriks illustrates the idea with a toy example: a pattern of behaviour regarding co-habitation and sexual activity and the use of various goods develops in a community. The community members recognise that this pattern is in place, and norms or rules emerge that regulate future behaviour to conform to the pattern. These tacitly accepted regulative rules have now, according to Hindriks, created new action possibilities that can be made explicit by constitutive rules (by the introduction of terms like ‘husband’ and ‘wife’, say). Tuomela neither denies nor confirms that regulative rules can play the role envisaged by Hindriks, but he instead argues that constitutive rules sometimes play a role in “constituting and creating groups capable of acting as groups” (p. 216). Hindriks’ argument and Tuomela’s response are both interesting, and seem in my view complementary.


Another prominent theme is Tuomela’s concept of “we-mode”, and more generally, what a “mode account” of collective intentionality might amount to. This is framed by a now customary classification of different accounts of collective intentionality according to where the account in question locates ‘collectivity’: in the subject of the collective intentional state, in its mode, or/and in its content? Tuomela’s own complex we-mode account cannot easily be shoehorned into this scheme (see Laitinen’s essay, p. 148, n. 1), but Tuomela submits that it “can be regarded as primarily a subject account” (p. 74).


According to Schmitz, as well as Schmid, a mode account of collective intentionality promises to avoid, on the one hand, taking the bearer of a collective intentional state to be a group subject that is “over and above” the group members, as well as, on the other hand, taking collective intentionality to simply be a matter of what members of a group intend or believe. The latter ought to be avoided, according to both Schmitz and Schmid, because the idea that ordinary individual intentions can have as their content a group action (“that we walk”, say) is incoherent or at least problematic (see pp. 37-38, 82). In light of these remarks, they each go on to argue for their own distinctive mode account of collective intentionality. As they acknowledge though, Schmitz’s account in the end turns out to be a special kind of content account, and Schmid’s account a special kind of subject account.


In Schmitz’s rich and wide-ranging essay, he presents an account according to which, when an individual is in a mental state, the agent represents, not only some state of affairs (the “what-content”), but also her own attitude toward it (the “attitude mode content”) and the attitude’s subject (the "subject mode content"). The represented subject of the attitude could, for example, be herself as an individual (I), her group (we), or herself as a holder of an institutional or social role ("As a book reviewer, I . . . ") Schmitz suggests that his framework would allow Tuomela to elaborate on how we-mode attitudes are “manifest in the mind” of an individual, as well as allow him to be more unabashedly realist about intentional group agents and their intentional states. In Schmitz’s view, a group agent or subject simply consists of individuals who stand in certain intentional relations to each other, and these individuals “become a collective subject by jointly representing its [attitudes]” (p. 66).


Schmitz’s essay is an interesting and lively read, but due to the range of topics dealt with, some of the claims he makes are not, in this essay at least, explained or defended in the detail they deserve. It was not always clear to me how the proposed framework is substantially different from a “regular” content approach (e.g. Tuomela and Miller 1988). For example, it is not obvious why it is less problematic for an intention to concern a group action if the “we” is in its subject mode content than if it is in its what-content.


Schmid first examines and rejects three interpretations of what the we-mode might be: a psychological/attitude mode, a mode of presentation, or a representation of a formal object. He then argues that Schmitz is right to think of the we-mode as associated with a subject’s sense of who is the subject of an attitude she herself has, as a group member. But Schmid argues that it is not a matter of (plural) self-representation, but rather a “plural pre-reflective self-awareness.” According to Schmid, this self-awareness is a plural subject, where the latter should not be understood as an additional higher-level group mind, but as “a plural form of the individuals’ mind” (p. 91). Hence, Schmid submits that his mode account (Schmid 2014) is really a subject account. Schmid’s essay is well written and illuminating: it clearly demonstrates how one can be led to embrace his radical view. But since I think it is relatively unproblematic for individuals to have intentions that concern group actions (with a content such as “that we walk,” for example), I fail to see why we must follow Schmid to the dizzying conclusion.


Schmid draws from Tuomela the (as he calls it) “important and fundamental insight” that a we-mode attitude that a group member has is a “relational state” that depends ontologically on the group attitude that it is part of (p. 80). Thus, in a case where all other group members have opted out and there is no group intention, I can at most falsely believe that I have a we-intention. Thus, Tuomela and Schmid both accept a kind of “social externalism” concerning collective intentionality. (By contrast, Schmitz rejects it [pp. 67-68]). Martin Rechenauer explores this in more depth. He proposes a new argument for social externalism about mental content that is based on Tuomela’s account of we-mode collective intentionality. I will not go into the details of Rechenauer’s argument, but it has the advantage of not depending on contentious intuitions about Twin Earth-style thought experiments. Instead, it depends on what I take to be a contentious premise, namely that all reductive accounts of collective intentionality fail.


Indeed, Kirk Ludwig argues that we can give a reductive account of three core phenomena that Tuomela associates with the we-mode (group reason, the collectivity condition, and collective commitment) — that is, Ludwig claims we can give an account that employs only concepts that are needed for understanding individual agency anyway (see Ludwig 2016). Ludwig tries to find a neutral common ground between himself and Tuomela, by characterising the phenomena in such a way that they, prima facie at least, don’t rule out a successful individualistic reduction by definition. It seems to me that this is a reasonable research strategy. But it is clear from Tuomela’s response that it has failed, in the sense that they have failed to reach a common starting point.


Ludwig’s essay brings me to the third important theme. While Tuomela stresses the significance of the we-mode and group-level intentional states for understanding human sociality, he also recognises that some forms of cooperation and reasoning can be given reductive individualistic explanations. Tuomela associates reductive accounts of joint intentional action (e.g. Bratman 2014) with such “I-mode” cooperation and reasoning, where participants think and act as private persons rather than as group members.


One of the core ideas in Tuomela’s 2013 book is that irreducible we-mode thinking and acting best explains how people rationally solve some coordination problems, such as the so-called “Hi-Lo” problem. The problem can be illustrated with (a simplified version of) an example from Raul Hakli’s and Pekka Mäkelä’s carefully argued essay (see p. 135). Suppose that you and I each intend that we paint our house, and each of us is at a separate paint store to buy one can of paint each. We haven’t agreed on whether to buy oil paint or latex paint, but it is common knowledge between us that we each prefer oil paint to latex paint. Mixing different kinds of paint is not possible, we cannot communicate, and we must each buy one can of paint now. Using numbers to represent the expected utility for each, we get something like the following:














Orthodox game theory cannot predict or advice what each would or should do in this game. This is because, in this theory, each of us is restricted to “best-reply reasoning.” That is, each of us is restricted to finding the best reply to whatever it is that we expect the other to do, where best reply is defined in terms of what maximises our own individual, “private,” utility. All the theory recommends for each is to buy oil paint if the other does, and to buy latex paint otherwise. However, what most actual players do is to converge on the Pareto optimal equilibrium (<Oil, Oil>). Intuitively, this also seems like the obvious rational choice for each of us. Now, according to Tuomela, “I-mode” cooperation and reasoning is restricted to such best-reply reasoning and thus fails to make sense of people’s actual behaviour and our intuitions about rationality.


According to Tuomela, best-reply reasoning fails to make sense of this even in the case where each of us intends that we do what is best for “us,” that is, what maximises group utility (assume that group utility is equal to the average of the players’ utilities). His we-mode theory, he argues, has no such problems (for discussion, see Petersson 2016). The idea, roughly, is that players who reason as group members in the we-mode ask, “What should the group agent that you and I are members of do?”, rather than “What should I do?” That is, they engage in so-called “team reasoning” (see Karpus and Gold 2016). They then proceed to do their parts of the joint action that is best for the group agent.


Ludwig argues that a particular version of this argument fails (see Tuomela 2013, pp. 188-189). According to Ludwig, if it is common knowledge between us both (i) that each of us intends that we maximise group utility and (ii) that there is a unique outcome that maximises group utility, then we do not need irreducible we-mode reasoning to rationally bring about the Pareto optimal outcome in Hi-Lo. If I understand Ludwig correctly, his point is that if I intend that we maximise group utility, then my intention is guaranteed to be unsatisfied if I buy latex paint, even if you do the same. After all, we have not maximised group utility, and thus not done what I intended that we do. Given that I know that you intend that we maximise group utility, and know that you know that I intend it, etc., neither of us has a reason to reconsider and revoke our intention. There is thus no need for either of us to reason about what the group agent that we are members of should do (but it is assumed that we nevertheless have group preferences). As far as I can see, Ludwig at least rebuts Tuomela’s claim about the necessity of the we-mode in the non-probabilistic case where the game and the players’ intentions are common knowledge.


However, as Tuomela (2009, p. 298) has elsewhere pointed out, cases where we have intentions to bring about a general goal such as maximising group utility are very unusual. In Hakli and Mäkelä’s oil/latex paint case, each intends to bring about the goal that we paint the house. This outcome would perhaps maximise group utility, but this does not mean that we intend to bring such maximisation about. Rather, the group preferences determine which subplans each ought to form in implementing the intention that we paint the house. In such a case, does I-mode reasoning suffice for predicting and recommending each to buy oil paint? Arguably, the answer is “no”, at least if I-mode reasoning is limited to best-reply reasoning.


According to Hakli and Mäkelä, the oil/latex paint case is an example of the kind of basic form of small-scale shared agency that Bratman’s (2014) “I-mode” account is supposed to explain. But is team reasoning compatible with his reductive ambition of explaining shared agency exclusively by appeal to resources needed anyway for making sense of individual agency? Hakli and Mäkelä don’t give a definitive answer, but show that Bratman’s account at least has a lacuna. It is worth pointing out, though, that theories of team reasoning aren’t the only theories that go beyond best-reply reasoning that Bratman could draw on (see e.g. Morton [2003, ch. 1] on solution-based thinking, or Butterfill [2015] on parallel planning).


Hakli and Mäkelä’s main concern is to address a lacuna in Tuomela’s account of group agency: a theory of planning at the level of the group agent, or a theory of we-mode planning. Their essay also contains an interesting discussion about the relation between team reasoning and planning, where they argue that theories of team reasoning and planning both deviate from orthodox game theory by rejecting what they call the “atomistic act evaluation principle.” According to this principle, the evaluation (expected utility) of an agent’s next action should be based on the value of that action itself, rather than of some larger activity of which it is a part (such as a joint action or a temporally extended action).


Beyond the three main themes mentioned, Schweikard and Laitinen both deal with conflicts between reasons that an individual has in virtue of being a member in a particular group and other reasons, which are entirely private or rooted in other group memberships. (Think of Sartre’s case of a young man torn by the choice of either fighting with the Free French or taking care of his mother. Schweikard’s essay contains a penetrating and careful discussion of how best to interpret Tuomela’s claim that group reasons are pre-emptive with respect to private reasons, and how to understand Tuomela’s (2013, p. 38) claim that “[a]n ideal we-moder can think and act only for group-centered motives, regardless of whether they conflict with individualistic motives.” Schweikard’s conclusion, which is in tension with Tuomela’s view, is that “the force of group allegiance is not in principle stronger than the force of other considerations” (p. 110). Somewhat similarly, Laitinen suggests that we must posit an “overall mode,” from which the authorities and reasons of different we-mode groups that an individual belongs to can be assessed and weighted. In part, Tuomela responds to Schweikard and Laitinen by appealing to a big-picture methodological approach that involves a good measure of idealization and simplification (see pp. 113-114, 175). Tuomela thus points out that he takes group reasons to be pre-emptory “under normal circumstances — perhaps not in other cases” (p. 115). With that, I conclude this overview of an interesting collection of essays.




Thanks to Facundo Alonso, Mattias Gunnemyr, Frank Hindriks, Felipe León and Björn Petersson for comments on an earlier draft.




Bratman, M. E. (2014). Shared Agency: A Planning Theory of Acting Together. Oxford University Press.


Butterfill, S. A. (2015). Planning for Collective Agency. In C. Misselhorn (ed.), Collective Agency and Cooperation in Natural and Artifical Systems (Vol. 122, pp. 149-168). Springer Verlag.


Karpus, J., and Gold, N. K. (2016). Team Reasoning: Theory and Evidence. In  J. Kiverstein (ed.), Routledge Handbook of Philosophy of the Social Mind. Routledge-Taylor Francis.


Ludwig, K. (2016). From Individual to Plural Agency. Collective Action: Volume I. Oxford University Press.


Morton, A. (2003). The Importance of Being Understood: Folk Psychology as Ethics. Routledge.


Petersson, B. (2016). Team Reasoning and Collective Intentionality. Review of Philosophy and Psychology, 1-20.


Tuomela, R. (2009). Collective Intentions and Game Theory. The Journal of Philosophy, 106(5), 292-300.


Tuomela, R. (2013). Social Ontology: Collective Intentionality and Group Agents. Oxford University Press.


Tuomela, R. and Miller, K. (1988). We-intentions. Philosophical Studies, 53(3), 367-389.


Schmid, H. B. (2014). Plural self-awareness. Phenomenology and the Cognitive Sciences, 13(7), 7-24.