Of Liberty and Necessity: The Free Will Debate in Eighteenth-Century British Philosophy

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James A. Harris, Of Liberty and Necessity: The Free Will Debate in Eighteenth-Century British Philosophy, Oxford University Press, 2005, 280pp, $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 0199268606.

Reviewed by Sean Greenberg, Johns Hopkins University


James Harris aims to elucidate the British debate about human freedom in the 'long' eighteenth century that begins with the 1690 publication of Locke's An Essay Concerning Human Understanding and concludes with the 1828 publication of Dugald Stewart's The Philosophy of the Moral and Active Powers of Man. But the book actually reaches back to the Hobbes-Bramhall debate that began with the unauthorized publication of Hobbes' Of Liberty and Necessity in 1654, and it concludes with some discussion of the continuation of the eighteenth-century free will debate in the nineteenth century and the transformation of that debate at the beginning of the twentieth century. At the heart of the book, Harris considers the accounts of freedom elaborated by Locke, Clarke, Collins, King, Hume, Kames, Edwards, Butler, Berkeley, Price, Beattie, Hartley, Tucker, Priestley, Reid, Gregory, and Stewart. Harris deepens our understanding of the history of eighteenth-century British accounts of freedom by placing the well known accounts of Locke, Hume, and Reid -- to which he devotes a chapter apiece -- in a richer context than is usually considered by historians of early modern philosophy. His discussion of Hume's 'reconciling' project in An Enquiry Concerning Human Understanding especially manifests the benefits of his approach to British eighteenth-century discussions of free will, and I recommend this chapter to all readers interested in Hume's treatment of the "long disputed question concerning liberty and necessity." Harris also introduces readers to accounts of freedom -- such as those of King, Kames, and Edwards -- that have received relatively little attention from historians of early modern philosophy and that deserve more attention. Harris' focus throughout is on the arguments about free will advanced by British philosophers: he eschews comparisons with contemporary discussions of free will, and devotes little attention to the political, religious, and moral contexts in which British eighteenth-century philosophers developed their accounts of free will. "I am interested," Harris writes in the preface of the book, "in what is characteristic of eighteenth-century thought about the will, and in what differentiates it from the thought that came before and the thought that came after" (p. vii).

What is distinctive of eighteenth-century British philosophy, according to Harris, is that it is experimental philosophy, "philosophy which aims to be true to the facts of experience" (p. 2). Eighteenth-century readers saw An Essay Concerning Human Understanding as having introduced the experimental method that Newton had pioneered for the study of matter into the study of the mind, and Harris traces the methodology of British eighteenth-century accounts of freedom to Locke. Although Harris recognizes Newton's significance for eighteenth-century British philosophy -- he draws attention to the way in which Hume, Hartley, Priestley, and Reid all refer to Newton in support of their own approaches to mind and human freedom (pp. 64-65, 156-157, 172-173, 195) -- he particularly emphasizes Locke's methodological significance for eighteenth-century British philosophy, and he begins his narrative by examining Locke's account of freedom. Harris suggests that the substantial revisions which that account of freedom underwent over the course of the various editions of An Essay Concerning Human Understanding reflect "renewed attention to the experience of choice" (pp. 12, 20) on Locke's part. Although Locke's successors retained a commitment to the experimental method in their discussions of freedom, manifest in the importance they attributed to conscious experience (p. 10), which they cite as evidence for their different accounts of freedom, they found Locke's account of freedom itself unsatisfactory: William Molyneux objected that it "seems so wonderfully fine spun … that at last the Great Question of Liberty and Necessity seems to vanish" (p. 26).

The question concerning liberty and necessity that Locke was taken to have missed and on which his successors focus, the question that drives the eighteenth-century British debate on freedom, concerns the relation between motives and acts of choice. "At its starkest, the question is this: are we free in our volitions? or is the influence of motives such that they do not merely 'dispose' or 'incline' choice, but necessitate it?" (p. 5). Harris locates the origins of this question in British philosophy in the Hobbes-Bramhall debate, and he takes the positions of Hobbes and Bramhall as points of reference for the accounts of freedom that he presents in the course of the book. Harris distinguishes three accounts of the relation between motives and choice that structure the problem space of the British eighteenth-century free will debate. Necessitarians, such as Hobbes, Collins, Edwards, Hartley, and Priestley, claim that motives determine choice, so that it is not the case that an agent could choose otherwise than she actually did. Libertarians such as Bramhall, Clarke, Price, and Reid, maintain that motives are not the kind of things that can determine choice: "a motive is better thought of as an occasion for the agent to exercise his will in a particular way" (p. 7). These philosophers admit that motives may 'morally necessitate' choice, but they insist that motives cannot physically necessitate choice. "In the case of any choice made in the past, it was possible for the agent to have chosen differently" (p. 6). A third position, which Harris attributes to a "small minority" of philosophers (p. 12) and associates chiefly with William King (pp. 12, 73), is that even the moral necessitation of the will by motives undermines freedom, which consists in the will's natural indifference to motives. (Harris calls this position "liberty of indifference"; for ease of reference, I henceforth call this position 'indifferentism'.) Harris characterizes indifferentism variously at different points in the book. He claims that the indifferentist: (a) "believes that freedom is most purely realized in the capacity to choose a certain way regardless of the recommendations of the understanding" (p. 13); (b) thinks that freedom consists in the ability "to set aside the deliverances of reason" (p. 22); and (c) holds "that a motive is not necessary to a particular exercise of the will" (p. 164).

Harris maintains that libertarians employ the concept of moral necessity in order to stake out a "middle way" between necessitarianism and indifferentism (pp. 6-7, 51-52). "It will be seen in this study," Harris writes, that the notion of moral necessity "plays a central role in discussion of the will in the eighteenth century. It allows, or perhaps merely appears to allow, the believer in the freedom of the will to distinguish between, on the one hand, the way in which a cause determines its effect, and on the other, the way in which a motive determines choice" (p. 7). It is important to Harris' argument that there be a sharp distinction between libertarianism and indifferentism. I'm not convinced, however, that Harris has accurately characterized the libertarian position. It seems to me that the libertarian is committed to asserting the natural indifference of the will, although the libertarian is not an indifferentist in Harris' sense, because he does not maintain that freedom requires the ability to set aside the deliverances of reason.

The idea that freedom consists in the will's indifference to motives is often called the Molinist account of freedom, after the Spanish Jesuit philosopher and theologian Luis de Molina. (The clearest formulation of the position, however, is to be found in Disputation 19 of Francisco Suárez's Metaphysical Disputations.) Molina originally developed this doctrine in order to account for the relation between human agency and divine grace as part of the counter-Reformation attempt to counter Lutheran and Calvinist doctrines of the servitude of man, and, as Harris notes, it was adopted by the Arminian Philip van Limborch for the same reason (p. 22). The Molinist account of freedom was characterized in the following formulation well known to early modern philosophers: a man is free, given that with all the requisites for action having been posited, he is able to act or not act. (Harris cites van Limborch's endorsement of this formulation on p. 22.) Interestingly, John Bramhall, whom Harris cites as a proponent of the moral necessitarian position, endorses the Molinist account of freedom in A Defence of True Liberty, From Antecedent and Extrinsical Necessity. Bramhall responds to Hobbes' claim that the ordinary definition of free will implies a contradiction, and is nonsense: "Let us see the definition itself: 'A free agent is that which, when all the things are present that are needful to produce the effect, can nevertheless not produce it.' I acknowledge the old definition of liberty … " (Vere Chappell, ed., Hobbes and Bramhall on Liberty and Necessity [Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1999], p. 63).

On the Molinist account of freedom, agents are said to be 'indifferent' with respect to their choices, because they determine themselves to choose as they do on the basis of perceptions, desires, etc., the 'requisites for action': in other words, Molinists believe that the requisites for action do not determine the agent's choice. (The determination in question here is what eighteenth-century British philosophers such as Clarke would have called natural or physical necessity.) Rather, with all the requisites for action having been posited, the will is able to determine itself to act or not to act, because it is an intrinsically free faculty that has power over itself and is therefore indifferent with respect to its determination.

The standard criticism of this view advanced by philosophers such as Hobbes, Cudworth, Locke, and Leibniz, and attributed by Harris to British eighteenth-century philosophers (see, inter alia, pp. 33-35, 51, 62), is that the indifference required for Molinist freedom implies that an agent might be able to choose for no reason at all. This criticism does not touch the Molinist position, however, for Molinists do not claim that a free agent chooses for no reason. What Molinists do claim is that reasons (what eighteenth-century British philosophers call motives) are not sufficient to determine the will: free choice requires that the will determine itself upon the occasion of certain reasons or motives being present to the mind. (Bramhall deploys an argument to this effect that closely follows Suárez: see Chappell, op. cit., p. 63). The point of this view is to attribute an agent's choice, say, to accept or reject grace, to the agent alone, not to the exciting cause of that choice, grace.

Harris assimilates the Molinist account of freedom to that of King. (In his remarks on King's Essay on the Origin of Evil appended to the Theodicy, Leibniz also charges that King follows the Molinists in framing his account of freedom.) While both the Molinists and King believe that freedom requires that the will be able to determine itself, King seems to accept the standard criticism of the Molinist account of freedom presented above. He charges that the capacity to reject the counsel of reason that Molinists attribute to the will implies an endorsement of irrationality and does not explain what is valuable about the capacity to determine oneself. On King's account of freedom, it is the act of choosing itself that is the good; consequently, however one exercises one's own free will, one is able to ensure one's happiness. "There is a happiness felt in the complete and proper exercise of all the powers that one has," Harris writes, "and therefore there is a happiness in making completely free choices, choices not determined by anything other than, as we might say, willfulness itself" (p. 45). This very interesting position differs from that of the Molinists, who do not believe that the act of choosing itself ensures happiness. What the Molinists are most concerned to maintain is that freedom requires the capacity for self-determination. If agents are to be free, then their choices must not be determined by reasons.

If this argument is correct, then Harris has somewhat mischaracterized the libertarian position. The core of the libertarian position is the claim that the will determines itself, a claim shared by Molinists, Bramhall, Clarke, and Reid. The libertarian appeal to moral necessity does not amount to a rejection of the indifference of the will central to the Molinist account of freedom; one might even see the libertarian appeal to moral necessity as an attempt to counter the charge that Molinism unhooks any connection between freedom and reason by drawing attention to the fact that free agents often do (freely) determine themselves in accordance with reason. It would therefore seem that the eighteenth-century British debate on free will is more continuous with the positions taken by earlier philosophers than Harris acknowledges.

This way of construing the libertarian position allows us to sharpen the opposition between libertarians and necessitarians. The libertarian maintains that the will is a self-determining power, and therefore believes that motives are not sufficient to explain choice. Necessitarians believe that the notion of a self-determining power is incomprehensible because they reject the conception of causation implicit in the libertarian account of freedom, following Hobbes, whose argument Harris paraphrases: "a cause of an event is by definition something sufficient to explain why the event took place when and where it did; and what is sufficient to explain an event is by definition something that explains the event" (p. 8; cf. pp. 57-58, 160, 168-169). Necessitarians therefore maintain that motives are sufficient to determine choices.

The British eighteenth-century debate on free will thus hardens into the opposed positions of the necessitarian and the libertarian. Harris suggests that "one reason for this is that underlying general consensus as to the importance of experience to philosophy was profound disagreement about what exactly it meant, in Hume's phrase, 'to introduce the experimental method of reasoning into moral subjects' … . it does seem to be true that in the eighteenth century, and perhaps in the nineteenth century as well, one's stance with regard to the will and its freedom was to a significant extent shaped by one's conception of what the science of the mind should look like" (p. 18). Harris does a fine job of showing how both necessitarians and libertarians appealed to experience in support of their positions. But why did necessitarians and libertarians adopt the positions that they do? And why do the same arguments for those positions seem to recur throughout the debate? It may be that what is needed in order to answer these questions is more attention to the moral and theological contexts in which British eighteenth century discussions of freedom were located. It is a virtue of Harris' book to have presented the positions in the British eighteenth-century free will debate so extensively and clearly that such a question may now even be raised.