Of Myth, Life and War in Plato's Republic

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Baracchi, Claudia, Of Myth, Life and War in Plato's Republic, Indiana University Press, 2001, 280pp, $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 0253214858.

Reviewed by Robert Metcalf, University of Colorado, Denver


Claudia Baracchi offers something extraordinary to readers of her book, Of Myth, Life and War in Plato’s Republic. I will not say that the book “adds” anything to Plato scholarship, for as Baracchi says in the book’s Introduction, her purpose is rather to subtract from the sediment of commentary layered upon Plato’s text. As she explains it, the book attempts “to encourage a certain emptying, a certain hesitation to embrace all too customary assumptions” (3). It seems to me that the book succeeds in this attempt, and does so principally through its receptiveness to what is extravagant in Plato’s text—that surprising or disconcerting extravagance which we might otherwise eliminate if we were not receptive to the text in the way Baracchi suggests (4-5). Through such receptiveness the book itself becomes extravagant in the literal sense of wandering outside the customary bounds of interpretation.1 No doubt some readers will find Baracchi’s reading extravagant in other ways—for example, in its unhesitancy to make provocative claims, or its determination to engage Plato’s text from within the language peculiar to contemporary Continental thought.2 Nonetheless, the reply will be, I take it, that this latter extravagance is something derivative, consequent upon that extravagance in Plato’s text to which Baracchi has skillfully focused our attention.

It is not surprising that the book grew out of an attempt to interpret the role of myth in Plato, and specifically the myth of Er at the conclusion of Plato’s Republic. Here an extravagant reading like Baracchi’s is required to move beyond the tradition of interpretation that either avoids the myth in the manner of Averroes (221-222), or else excises the myth as a “lame and messy ending” in the words of Julia Annas (6, 222). For Baracchi, saving this myth in the way the text enjoins involves a “receptiveness and responsiveness to the unexplainable” (219)—or, as she puts it somewhat differently, “letting it come into itself while letting it come to pass, granting it stability (if in passing), protecting it from pure dissipation … Above all, saving means keeping safe that strangeness that eludes and strains one, whose provenance one does not know, even as (especially as) that strangeness is one’s own” (118). Here the language itself reveals Baracchi’s constant emphasis upon the pathos fundamental to philosophy as such. Early in the book she captures the sense of this pathos as something “utterly passive,” “radically affective and receptive” with respect to what is described as “the primordially attuning, ineffably structuring environment of the conceptual effort” (19). While she does note, at one point, that the creativity of philosophy “stems from both the philosopher’s endurance and the philosopher’s receptivity to something wondrous” (54), her constant emphasis upon the latter poses certain difficulties that are instructive for the serious student of Plato.

This is perhaps most clear in Baracchi’s treatment of war in Plato’s Republic, which is not only a topic of discussion, but is, as she says, enacted throughout the dialogue (153). Tracing this theme, Baracchi illuminates the agonistic character of the Republic, and of the philosophical activity characteristic of Plato’s Socrates more generally.3 Indeed, this theme is announced in the opening scene of the Republic, where Socrates wonders whether there may not be an alternative to his being overpowered by Polemarchus and the others or his overpowering them, and then enacts such an alternative through the dialogical combat in which his opponents become his interlocutors (154). For Baracchi, Socrates’ dialogical combat is not driven by the “passion for disintegration,” but aims, rather, at transformation—”that death which is other than termination,” as she puts it, so that the transformation concerns oneself as much as one’s opponent, and both “in their belonging together” (156). From this dialogical combat Baracchi sharply distinguishes actual warfare, which, she says, “always presupposes a certain naïve self-confidence, the capacity for relatively unproblematic self-assertion” (156). Thus, on her analysis, actual war does not allow for dialogical combat—”the carrying out of a war on the battlefield (the falling of bodies, the spilling of blood) does not admit of the development of war in speech”—and conversely, dialogical combat “suspends war proper” (156). Since Baracchi considers Socratic dialogue to be “the place of the affirmation of incongruity,” it follows that dialogical combat is incompatible with and “clearly calls into question the unquestioning exercise of warfare in its possibility, the very possibility of practicing or even just promising war unquestioningly” (158).

Here we would do well to think about this relationship with the utmost care, especially in light of present circumstances. Some instances of dialogical combat are purely eristic and thus unphilosophical, just as some cases of actual warfare approximate the naïve, unquestioning self-confidence or self-assertion that Baracchi describes. But are we to conclude that there cannot be war without such naiveté, that it is impossible to enact warfare in the face of questioning? Such a claim is certainly possible, but Baracchi does not argue for her pacifism explicitly, and its imposition upon Plato’s text makes the interpretation appear rather tendentious. What is most striking about Plato’s thought on war—particularly in the Gorgias, the Republic and the Laws—lies in the close parallels drawn between philosophy and warfare, which suggests (with at least some degree of presumptive evidence) that Plato does not hold philosophy and warfare to be incompatible. Just as it is possible, in Plato’s texts, to engage one’s interlocutors agonistically and at the same time philosophically, so, we may presume, it is possible to engage in acts of war without prejudice to one’s commitment to philosophy.

Furthermore, this suggested compatibility between philosophy and warfare in Plato’s texts has important implications for a hermeneutic orientation toward Plato that claims an attunement to pathos. If philosophical dialogue is to enact war, it must not only constitute itself as “the place of the affirmation of incongruity,” as Baracchi says, but also as the vigilant effort to preserve the integrity of one’s position against challenges to it. Socrates suggests as much when, in Book VII of the Republic, he says:

Unless a man is able to separate out the idea of the good from all other things and distinguish it in the argument, and, going through every test as it were in battle [hôsper en machêi dia pantôn elenxôn diexiôn]—eager to meet the test [elenchein] of being rather than that of opinion—he comes through all this with the argument still on its feet [aptôti tôi logôi diaporeutêtai]; you will deny that such a man knows the good itself, or any other good? (534b-c)4

Though philosophy must involve the wonder, risk and openness to transformation emphasized by Baracchi (161), it could never reveal itself as dialogical combat if it were not animated by the will to not let the logos fail in the face of assault. This, it seems to me, is the only way we can understand Socrates’ commitment to be persuaded only by the logos (Crito 46b-48d), his resolve to not let the logos die (Phaedo 89b-c), and even his appeal to Achilles as an exemplar of moral resoluteness (Apology 28c, ff).5

In this light we can see why the issues of self and other, identity and alterity, are the focal points of Baracchi’s discussion of war in Plato’s dialogue.6 Baracchi addresses this “intimate relation of thought and war” in her discussion of how war emerges in Socrates’ account with the founding of the polis as “unitary, self-same and self-enclosed … fundamentally at war with its other” (165). While, at first glance, it may appear that the polis will necessarily be poised toward the “denial of difference” and “destruction of the other” (165), it is shown that the text, in Baracchi’s words, “lets transpire, however fleetingly, suggestions to the effect that alterity may be acknowledged otherwise than through the invention of the other concomitant with the founding of sameness/identity” (167). This means, then, that Socrates’ polis will acknowledge alterity even as it struggles for survival, and so will exhibit “the restless reformulation of its shape and identity” (168). Of course, such a formulation could equally well apply to Socrates’ vigilant concern for the logos within dialogical combat. For he must continually acknowledge alterity and, even more, allow for some degree of transformation in the logos in order to preserve it—and this holds whether we are speaking of the definition of justice or the mythic account of Er. Thus, it turns out that Socratic dialogue and Socratic warfare are intimately related, and the claim that they are incompatible (even mutually exclusive) seems to presuppose that philosophy is more wholly a matter of pathos than it really is—at least, for Socrates.

In an earlier essay, Baracchi offers a meditation on the limits of pathos as a fundamental characterization of philosophical thinking.7 Noting Nietzsche’s appreciation of thaumazein as the philosophical pathos, Baracchi captures the important nuances in Nietzsche’s view of this pathos:

What shines through such an image, then, is the overwhelming experience of exposure to the wondrous, the suffering involved in letting oneself be determined and guided by the indeterminate, the awe and astonishment at undergoing an impression that cannot be absolutely appropriated but only indeterminately received. From this fundamental state does philosophy arise—as the laborious articulation of the experience of powerlessness, as the articulation of passion. But … philosophy, as this passionate articulation, is not itself merely passive, merely powerless. In fact, it reverts into a kind of action, of which writing would be mere instrument and corollary … [A]s philosopher, Plato would precisely image an agitating force, a force whose de-forming, de-structuring and trans-forming character would reflect the philosophical experience of an abysmal suffering.8

For Nietzsche, the transforming character is something found in Plato the man, the political agitator, for whom even the founding of the Academy is to be understood primarily in political terms (Werke 9: 238f.). Still, what is valuable about Nietzsche’s view is the idea—certainly applicable to Plato’s writings—that “the passion of philosophy comes to be reflected in an action resembling, rather, self-undoing and pervasive agitation.”9 If this is how we are to understand what Baracchi calls “the action of the passion of philosophy,”10 then pathos is clearly not a matter of mere passivity.

My point in raising these illuminating passages from an earlier essay is not to argue that Baracchi is wrong to focus attention on the importance of pathos in Plato’s Republic as something “utterly passive” (19), but to underscore her point that the creativity of the philosopher—at least, or above all, the creativity of Plato’s thought—”stems from both the philosopher’s endurance and the philosopher’s receptivity to something wondrous” (54). In any case, the danger would be one of stressing philosophy’s relationship to the pathos of wonder while, at the same time, losing sight of philosophy’s fundamental allergy to what Aristotle calls the life lived through the pathê [pathê zôntes] (EN X.8, 1179a13). For, in the same dialogue where Socrates identifies wonder as the philosophical pathos and the archê philosophias (Theaetetus 155d), Socrates exhibits this fundamental allergy in the following words:

I should be ashamed to see us forced into making the kinds of admissions I mean while we are still at a loss [aporoumen]. If we find what we’re after and become freemen, then we will turn around and talk about how these things are suffered [paschontôn] by others—having secured our own persons against ridicule [ektos tou geloiou]. While if we can’t find any way of extricating ourselves, then I suppose we shall be laid low, like sea-sick passengers, and give ourselves over to the logos [parexomen tôi logôi] and let it trample all over us and do what it likes with us. (190e-191a)

I take it that this allergy is, in large measure at least, the reason why the dialogues dramatized by Plato are so often agonistic in character, why dialogue in Plato is often (if not always) a matter of dialogical combat.

To conclude, then, Baracchi’s extravagant reading of Plato’s Republic does succeed in the effort to subtract from Plato scholarship, principally by allowing the reader to step outside customary interpretations and see the text in a novel way. Given the prevailing silence among commentators as to the pathos to which philosophy is attuned, Baracchi’s attention to this pathos, as a primary hermeneutic directive, is something from which all Plato scholars can learn a great deal. We can certainly be grateful to Baracchi for revealing ever more vividly the extravagance in Plato’s text to which her own writing is a receptive response. Admittedly, there are a variety of ways in which one might be responsive to this extravagance. It behooves all interpreters, for example, to tread carefully around those moments of extravagance in Plato, canvassing the interpretive work of those before us, responding conscientiously to the text through the cultivation of one’s own hermeneutic conscience, like the “intellectual conscience” of which Nietzsche writes. For her part, Baracchi has responded to the extravagance of Plato’s text in so receptive a way that her own writing becomes extravagant in the process, thus resembling the saying of Socrates which she describes, in her own words, as “haunted by a numinous nebulosity” (122). If we agree with Baracchi that the book does not “add” anything to Plato studies, we should nonetheless insist that it is a promising sign of things to come.


1. Baracchi gives attention to this literal meaning of extravagant as extra vagans in her discussion of the “ek-static character” of Er’s wandering (139).

2. To give but one example, I suppose that readers unsympathetic to Heidegger’s thought will run afoul of the following line of questioning from the Introduction: “What function do the dominant readings of Plato serve, which, in the end, amount to one and the same, sharing as they do fundamental presuppositions concerning Plato, Platonic idealism, Platonic dualism, Platonic totalitarianism, etc.? What is it that is thereby made possible, enabled?…Could it be that what is allowed, invisibly sustained, however remotely configured by such stories is an almost immediate perception of the world as standing reserve, the stance of domination and technologico-scientific mastery?” (5).

3. Helpfully, Baracchi draws attention to Socrates’ customary use of warlike language [(dia)machein, etc.] to describe his dialogical efforts, and she cites passages from the Republic and other texts—such as Socrates’ appeal to Achilles in the Apology (151-152).

4. Quotation from Allan Bloom’s translation (1968), The Republic of Plato, Basic Books.

5. In each of these cases, Socrates turns his interlocutor’s (or audience’s) attention to the importance of remaining [menein] by one’s commitments, remaining where one has been stationed by oneself or by one who is better, and thus demonstrates his own commitment to the integrity of his (moral) position in the face of changing circumstances.

6. Though Baracchi refers to the Republic as “Plato’s dialogue of war,” it clearly is not Plato’s only dialogue of war. Indeed, the Gorgias, which begins with the words polemou kai maches, would provide Baracchi a useful comparison for many of her observations about the thematics of warfare in Republic: e.g., the “heaviness” that she finds in the Republic might usefully be compared with the oft-noticed “bitterness” of Plato’s Gorgias.

7. See Baracchi, “Plato’s Shadows at Noon,” Research in Phenomenology XXV (1995), 90-117.

8. Ibid, 103.

9. Ibid, 104.

10. Ibid, 104.