Of Reality: The Purposes of Philosophy

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Gianni Vattimo, Of Reality: The Purposes of Philosophy, Robert T. Valgenti (tr.), Columbia University Press, 2016, 235pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780231166966.

Reviewed by  David Vessey, Grand Valley State University


Writers are often told to wait to write their introduction until they have finished their book, for only then do they know all they are going to say. In Of Reality Gianni Vattimo, after dozens of books and decades of philosophical and political leadership in Italy, has written the best introduction to his work. Especially in his Gifford Lectures and the accompanying essays, Vattimo clearly sums up his thinking. He reintroduces many of the key positions he argued for in the 70s, 80s, and 90s, thematically connecting them with his political and religious work from the first part of the twentieth century. There are no new views here; instead he focuses on pushing his nihilistic rejection of any absolutes to its most consistent, systematic, and radical conclusion.

The book signals Vattimo's return to articulating a theory of "weak thought" -- the dissolution of dogmatic self-certainty that follows from taking seriously a legitimate plurality of viewpoints. It's a kind of fallibilism which he refers to as "nihilism." Although he doesn't mention them by name, the title of the book and some of the essays, especially "The Temptation of Realism," show he is concerned with responding to the Neo-realist criticisms of his views, perhaps most especially those put forth by his former student and current colleague Maurizio Ferraris.

Vattimo believes we are in a hermeneutic age when everything is understood as an interpretation. Because of this, the philosophical tradition of hermeneutics is best suited to make sense of the times. Hermeneutics is the philosophical tradition that has argued that the basic perceptual and conceptual relations between humans and the world are best understood as forms of interpretation. It emphasizes the continuity of the sciences and the arts as practices of creating intelligibility. Vattimo owns a distinctively nihilistic place in the tradition that otherwise includes Friedrich Schleiermacher, Wilhelm Dilthey, Martin Heidegger, Hans-Georg Gadamer, and Paul Ricœur.

Vattimo thinks that one of Nietzsche's notebook entries foretold the conceptual destiny of hermeneutics: "there are no facts, only interpretations, and this too is an interpretation" (83-84). Vattimo claims that the nineteenth-century hermeneutic philosophers Schleiermacher and Dilthey never fully appreciated the "and this too is an interpretation." Only Heidegger, and the version of phenomenological hermeneutics that extends from Heidegger through Gadamer, Vattimo's teacher, appreciates that hermeneutics is essentially a form of "nihilism" -- the abandonment of any claim to an independently existing reality.

Defenders of Heidegger and Gadamer argue against the suggestion that their phenomenologically inspired theories of hermeneutics are idealistic and historicist. Vattimo sides with the critics and embraces both idealism and historicism. Since everything is an interpretation, even the criteria for selecting among interpretations, we have no choice but to choose, and every choice reflects our interests. Even the attempt to argue against Vattimo for the existence of non-interpreted reality is never more than an expression of an interest. Since he claims the current philosophical temperament is most reasonably characterized as a hermeneutic "koiné" -- that is, hermeneutics and its emphasis on interpretation is the common vocabulary dominant in contemporary culture and philosophy -- realism is an interest in the right-wing, conservative resistance against the implicit fulfillment of our most reasonable philosophical culture. He claims that any appeal to an independent, un-interpreted reality -- including those made by versions of hermeneutics that do not accept Nietzsche's "and this too is an interpretation" -- must be mere expressions of force of will. The attempt to justify a belief in un-interpreted reality can only come about through domination, through forms of intellectual or political violence.

The book includes two main lecture series, given twelve years apart.  They thematically overlap, but have different foci. The Leuven Lectures were given to an academic audience at a university famous for housing the Husserl archives. In the first two lectures Vattimo connects his understanding of Nietzsche with Heidegger's critique of metaphysics and his history of the forgetting of Being. The third lecture, "The Age of the World Picture," addresses what to make of science "if we say there are no facts, only interpretations" (52). These are all technical lectures presuming an audience already familiar with Heidegger's views.

Metaphysics, which is one target of Vattimo's "weak thought," is understood by him as the acceptance of an absolute, unchanging reality which can be known by a few and must be imposed on the rest through political and intellectual violence, primarily through the technological "total organization" of the world. It's not clear which philosophers he thinks endorse metaphysics in this sense, nonetheless it is the greatest "evil," according to Vattimo. Anything short of the nihilistic recognition that everything is interpretation, that all interpretations are expressions of the interest of the interpreter, and that the acceptance of interpretations is ultimately and only a matter of politics, drops one down the slippery slope to violent oppression. In Not Being God Vattimo claims the Leuven Lectures show that "the very notion of reality is violent" (153).

The Gifford Lectures are shortened and edited versions of the longer papers he read in Glasgow in 2010. (The full lectures are available online.) These are more accessible. His second lecture, "Beyond Phenomenology," is rich in its discussion of the relationship between Husserl and Heidegger, though it does not break new ground for those already familiar with both thinkers. His third lecture, "Being and Event," presents Heidegger's understanding of Being as an event as both a way to move beyond the temptation of realism and to recognize the importance of our freedom to inaugurate events. The fourth lecture, "The Ethical Dissolution of Reality," continues the theme of "an ethical-political program . . . that does not have absolute values as a point of reference" (118).

Vattimo presents his rejection of any form of realism as a practical choice in response to a historical moment in need of greater freedom. He claims that the only moral choice -- the only choice that affirms freedom and that acknowledges the irreducible plurality and legitimacy of interpretations -- is his nihilistic hermeneutics. He acknowledges his argument is circularly self-supporting, but he holds all views are circularly self-supporting, and at least he is honest about it. He thinks that at some level we all feel this circularity, therefore the desire for some fixed reality is a "neurosis" (20) that keeps us from being able to face what we actually know. We can still speak about truth, he claims; truth, though, is only relative to a paradigm. Vattimo takes this as Kuhn's position and thus also concludes that the truth claims in the sciences are merely paradigm-dependent.

Vattimo discusses some views of analytic philosophers as well. The first Gifford Lecture is "Tarski and the Quotations Marks." It takes the Tarskian sentence "P" is true iff P as if it were announcing a correspondence theory of truth between something expressed with scare quotes "P" -- some thing, perhaps not the actual thing -- and a thing which exists fully determinate and independent from any human interaction. This is not at all what Tarski's theory is about. Vattimo's reply that the P should also be in scare quotes too --"Does the second P really stand outside quotation marks?" (83) -- shows he hasn't actually sought to understand Tarski's theory. He is simply using whatever he thinks it means in order to make his point. That is a shame, since Tarski's theory has been taken up by thinkers Vattimo could be sympathetic to: namely, Richard Rorty, Hilary Putnam, and Donald Davidson.

The two lecture series are supplemented with nine essays, all expertly translated by Robert T. Valgenti, quite readable, and helpful for understanding Vattimo's views. Only one, "Metaphysics and Violence," was previously published. They tend to cover the same ground as the two sets of lectures, with the exceptions of "True and False Universalism" and "The Evil That Is Not, 1 and 2," which connect together his lectures with his understanding of Christianity.

The final essay, "From Dialogue to Conflict," ends by discussing Heidegger's Nazism. Vattimo does not defend Heidegger's decision to join the Nazi Party, but he believes that if we use that "unfortunate choice" to dismiss Heidegger's philosophical contributions we will lose the theoretical tools needed to properly understand our current historical and political situation. Only Heidegger, he thinks, understood the threat of "metaphysics" -- evil, dominating, destructive of freedom, violent; only Heidegger, he thinks, saw existence as a project; only Heidegger, he thinks, saw the history of Being as a sequence of Kuhnian paradigms. Yet, Heidegger didn't present the history of Being in ways analogous to Kuhnian paradigms; Heidegger isn't the only philosopher to think of existence as a project, the pragmatists did as well. There is an intentional outrageousness to Vattimo's claim that we are living in a more insidious time than Heidegger's Nazi Germany, with the implication that unless we reject reality and embrace nihilism we will be making a worse choice than Heidegger made.

Vattimo has done us a philosophical service by pushing his nihilism and relativism as far as it can go. He accepts all the paradoxes that come with the conclusion that propositions can only be justified from within a paradigm. The views of Nietzsche, Husserl, Tarski, Dewey, Heidegger, Wittgenstein, Gadamer, and McDowell all have been recast to serve Vattimo's paradigm. By becoming the most consistently radical nihilist, it appears he must abandon any concern for accurate and careful readings of others' views, as if there were something there to get right. He acknowledges he plays fast and loose with the texts he is interpreting. In the Gifford Lectures he admits what he has done is to "freely 'make use' of some Nietzsche texts to interpret our (my?) situation" (15). Later in those lectures he admits "it is very likely this radical sense might not have been Heidegger's intention when he wrote these words. But he ought to have and could be understood in that way" (117). And he acknowledges that his hermeneutic nihilism "is not found explicitly in Gadamer's work" (17). Through this interpretive approach Vattimo distances himself from the tradition of hermeneutics which has always held that there is something to learn from trying to get others right and, above all, to listen carefully and learn from views that are different from one's own. It's a striking intellectual failure for someone who wants to champion the tolerance of the left.

Vattimo has also shown us that a consistently radical nihilism can only be sustained through an absolute dichotomy between, on the one side, the evil, neurotic, reason-giving, oppressive, reactionary, anti-Christian, anti-democratic, violent individual who believes there could exist a reality independent of any interpretation, and, on the other side, the nihilistic, freedom-embracing, historicist, religious-war-ending, dialogical, historically self-aware, authentically existing, democratic, radically "weak-thinking" individual. By working out his views to their logical conclusion, Vattimo shows us how much of his thinking depends on this false dichotomy. His fallibilism is put to the side as he asserts a grand metanarrative of conceptual, political, and theological necessities; in this respect Rorty provides a more consistent model of a leftist political approach to philosophy. Vattimo would be better served by following Rorty in dismissing the whole debate between realists and anti-realists as resting on a mistake.

The advantage of an introduction this late in his career is that we can see how Vattimo weaves together themes across writings into something like a seamless whole. But by pushing his own view to its logical conclusion, he casts doubt on his key assertion that hermeneutics, the philosophical tradition that takes interpretation seriously, needs to become nihilistic through embracing the "Nietzschean" caveat that this too is an interpretation. This opens up a space for more nuanced and carefully argued positions to take hold, ones closer to the tradition of hermeneutics articulated by Schleiermacher, Dilthey, Gadamer, and Ricœur.