ohn Locke: Writings on Religion

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Locke, John, John Locke: Writings on Religion, edited by Victor Nuovo, Oxford University Press, 2002, 350pp, $19.95 (pbk), ISBN 0199243425.

Reviewed by Thomas Lennon , University of Western Ontario


Religion and theology are two spheres that converge for Locke, and together they provide a frame for most of his writings. Such is the premise for this collection. “The writings collected [here] should make clear that Locke’s interest in religion and theology was neither peripheral nor pursued for the sake of appearance … . religious concern was one of the main determinants of his intellectual pursuits” (lvii). Religion for Locke is the practice of revering God, and theology the discipline of informing, justifying and explaining that practice. The essential expression of Locke’s views in these two domains is gathered here.

The collection is intended to be, and undoubtedly will be, of use to philosophers, theologians and intellectual historians. Some will read the texts seriatim; many will use the work as a source book for consultation on specific topics only. (An example of such use is given at the end below—the topic of Locke’s alleged Socinianism.) It is especially important, therefore, that the index be good, which it seems to be. Moreover, the interest of the book is not restricted to religion and theology, but extends to general, metaphysical questions. For example, in “Adversaria 94,” a notebook from a short period in 1694 in which Locke speculates on, among several other topics, the possibility of material animality and spirituality. The date of this speculation places it not long after his addition to the Essay Concerning Human Understanding of his views on personal identity, and it goes well beyond the famous text (IV.iii.6), found in the first edition (1690), which queries “whether Omnipotency has not given to some Systems of matter fitly disposed, a power to perceive and think.”

There are twenty-one texts, grouped under seven headings: 1) Theology, its sources and the pragmatics of assent, 2) Morality and religion, 3) ’Adversaria theologica 94,’ 4) Inspiration, revelation, scripture, and faith, 5) The nature and authority of the church, 6) The reasonableness of Christianity, and 7) Fall and redemption. Each group is arranged chronologically. Thus, the reader is able to find the themes of interest, and to follow the development of them in Locke’s thought. The texts themselves are notebook entries, selections from other works, both published and well-known, and unpublished and unknown. An appendix contains the relevant passages from the Essay Concerning Human Understanding. A single list of the sources for each of the texts would have been useful; as the book stands, the information is there, but, on a principle not obvious to me, spread throughout.

There is a useful, eighteen-page set of endnotes that provides translations of Latin and Greek passages, context, bibliography, explanatory texts from Locke and other authors, etc. The critical apparatus is appropriate. The only mistake that I have found is that, in the title of Bayle’s work of 1682, “que les comètes” should replace “qui les comits,” which makes no sense (xxviii, n.33; also in the bibliography).

There is also a wonderful, forty-two page introduction that is in many respects a model of its kind. Clearly and elegantly, it argues the case for the centrality of religion and theology to Locke’s thought, and introduces each of the seven sections in turn, with helpful discussion in footnotes of the relevant bibliography of both primary and secondary sources. Throughout, Locke is depicted as representing an enlightened and universalistic version of Christianity, as opposed to the dogmatism of Rome and Geneva. The honorific epithets heaped upon this “Christian humanism” might beg the question of orthodoxy against Catholicism and Calvinism, each of which would view Locke’s rationalistic latitudinarianism as having given up the ghost. Still, there is an irresistible civility and decency that carries over from Locke into the introduction that will charm readers of every persuasion. Nor is its charm the introduction’s only virtue; it is patently very competent in every respect.

What was Locke’s religious and theological framework? The biographical fact of the matter is that he was a communicating member of the Church of England, who had the Psalms read to him on his deathbed. What Anglicanism meant to him, however, or what is to be found in, or entailed by, his writings, whether intended or not, are all questions of a different order. With an attitude typical of Boyle and others of the time, Locke sought his theology in both nature and scripture (natural and supernatural revelation). As Locke saw it, this rapprochement of reason and faith was already achieved by Christ himself, who overcame the distinction between the ancient priests’ role of propitiation and the ancient philosophers’ role of promulgating morality. Thus was Locke’s way opened to viewing Christianity as a religion of morality based on Scripture, itself open to easy, rational interpretation. It interprets itself, according to Locke, without need of an infallible interpreter such as the Church of Rome—which seems to me a rather naïve view. For the subsequent history of his sort of attitude reveals a drift into either creedless deism or fundamentalist enthusiasm, both of which Locke foreswore.

The best example, it seems to me, of the problem here is Locke’s understanding of the nature and role of Christ. He repeatedly refers to Christ as “our Savior,” but one wonders about the kind of salvation involved. From what does Christ save us? Certainly not from an imputed original sin, a concept that Locke rejects on the ground that Adam’s descendents could not be punished by a just God for a sin they did not commit. Instead, it is an epistemological matter. Although morality is a matter of the agreement and disagreement of ideas, and thus is as certain as mathematics, there are many impediments to our knowledge of it. These are overcome by Scripture. To be sure, faith justifies, and faith is based in Scripture, but the propositional content of Christianity reduces essentially to the single claim that Jesus is the messiah, belief in which, plus the moral life entailed by that belief, is sufficient for eternal (happy) life. Now, all of this smacks of what in the period was castigated as “Socinianism.” Was Locke a Socinian?

Here is what the editor takes to be the views of the source of the doctrine, Fausto Sozzini: he “denied the doctrines of the Trinity, the divinity of Christ, the immortality of the soul, and the satisfaction of Christ” (p.271). Now, Nuovo takes the charge of Socinianism against Locke to be false: “there is no evidence that [Locke] ever intended to propagate Socinianism” (li-lii). Certainly, Locke never intended to propagate Socinianism as such, for in his time the term was invariably deployed as a term of abuse. So it would have been paradoxical or perverse of him to do so. Nonetheless, all four of the denials that Nuovo attributes to Sozzini are arguably true of Locke as well. The fourth is discussed above; with no imputed original sin, there is nothing to be satisfied. Instead, the change wrought by Christ is the immortality of the just, with the wicked ultimately perishing in nihilo, which is to say that, if the soul of some is as a matter of fact immortal, the soul itself is not essentially immortal. The first denial hangs on the second. If Christ is not divine, then the triune God is relinquished. Although Locke never explicitly denied the divinity of Christ, the evidence he assembled in the “Adversaria 94” clearly favored the denial, such that given his own proto-Bayesian view of belief, he could hardly have avoided the denial.

All of this was immediately detected just from Locke’s published work. John Edwards made the charge explicit in 1695. Nor was he the only one with such worries; among others, Leibniz felt that Locke “inclined to the Socinians.” (For more see Nicholas Jolley, Leibniz and Locke: A study of the New Essays in Human Understanding, Clarendon Press, 1984, ch.2.) What was Locke’s response? Consider the following passage from his Vindication [sic] of the Reasonableness of Christianity:

I expound, [Edwards] says, John 14.9 &c. after the Antitrinitarian Mode: And I make Christ and Adam to be Sons of God, in the same sense, and by their Birth, as the Racovians [i.e. Socinians] generally do. I know not but it may be true, that the Antitrinitarians and Racovians understand those places as I do: But ’tis more than I know that they do so. I took not those Texts from those Writers, but from the Scripture it self, giving Light to its own meaning, by one place compared with another: What in this way appears to me its true meaning, I shall not decline, because I am told, that it is so understood by the Racovians, whom I never yet read. (Writings on Religion, p. 219)

Add to this weak statement the fact that Locke certainly had already read a great deal of Socinian literature and was familiar with Socinian doctrine, and his vindication becomes highly problematic.

The question of Locke’s alleged Socinianism raises many further questions, to begin with: what does the view mean? and what does it matter? (as a view, and whether Locke held it). Those who want more on the topic should have a look at the papers by Nuovo, by Udo Theil, and by John Marshall in M.A. Stewart, English Philosophy in the Age of Locke, Clarendon Press, 2000.