Omissions: Agency, Metaphysics, and Responsibility

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Randolph Clarke, Omissions: Agency, Metaphysics, and Responsibility, Oxford University Press, 2014, 227pp., $49.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780199347520.

Reviewed by Dana Kay Nelkin and Samuel C. Rickless, University of California, San Diego


This is a rich, dense, well-written, and thought-provoking book on a very important topic that has not received the kind of systematic attention that it deserves. Part of the reason for this, as Randolph Clarke rightly points out, is that the issues here straddle several different philosophical subfields, notably metaphysics (What are omissions?), philosophy of action (Are omissions actions, and refrainings intentional actions?), ethics (Can we be responsible and/or blameworthy for omissions? If so, how, and why?), and law (Can we be criminally liable for omissions?). It is a testament to Clarke’s versatility and virtuosity that he is able to integrate discussion of these matters into a largely seamless and philosophically rewarding whole.

The book has nine chapters. The first two discuss the metaphysics of omissions, the next two the nature of intentional omissions and the relation between omissions and abilities, the next two moral responsibility for omissions, and (leaving out chapter 8, which concerns the non-identity of the categories of omitting to do X and allowing Y to occur, and really serves as a kind of appendix to the first two chapters) the last two blameworthiness and legal culpability for omissions, particularly in cases of negligence.

Here are some of the highlights of Clarke’s investigation. Metaphysically, he distinguishes within the category of omissions between the ones that are intentional (refrainings) and the ones that are not (mere omissions). Clarke rejects the view (defended by John Martin Fischer and Mark Ravizza) that an agent’s omission (whether mere or not) is constituted, in whole or in part, by the movement or stillness of the agent’s body at some time. Clarke agrees with others (such as Myles Brand) that some refrainings are identical to negative acts. For example, a police officer who keeps her arm at her side in order not to shoot a fleeing youth refrains from shooting, and thereby exercises a negative form of agency. Clarke also agrees with yet others (such as Bruce Vermazen) that some refrainings are positive acts (such as acts of holding still), which are given negative descriptions (such as “not moving”). But what Clarke most wants to emphasize is that many omissions (and even many refrainings) should not be identified with negative or positive acts. They are, he argues, mere absences, non-entities. In an example that recurs throughout the book, Clarke imagines himself having promised his wife to buy some milk at the grocery store on his drive home, but then getting distracted and forgetting (that is, omitting) to purchase the milk. (It is noteworthy that this example is both eminently familiar as a kind of case of non-intentional omitting, but also relatively low-stakes in character. This latter feature might have implications later when it comes to generating intuitions concerning blameworthiness for omissions like this one.)

As Clarke sees it, this omission is neither identical with nor constituted by any particular negative or positive action of his. Rather, “there’s nothing at all that is [his] omission” (p. 5). However, he says, not all absences of action count as omissions, as the term “omission” is used in ordinary language. In general, in order for X to omit to A, it must be the case that there is some “norm, standard, or ideal” (such as would be created by a promise) that calls for X to A (p. 29).

Having criticized the claim that all omissions are (positive or negative) acts, Clarke rather quickly dismisses a series of alternative proposals defended in the secondary literature according to which omissions are entities of one kind or other: facts or truths (pp. 38-39), states of affairs (pp. 39-44), possibilia (pp. 44-45), uninstantiated act-types (pp. 45-46), sui generis objects (pp. 46-47), or features of space-time regions (p. 47). What is left is the view that omissions are non-entities. There is a sense in which the rest of the book is designed to make the theoretical world (whether semantic, metaphysical, ethical, or legal) safe for such non-entities. What Clarke proposes is an account of how we can talk truly about absence-omissions, count them, seemingly ascribe properties to them, talk truly of their causes and effects, intentionally engage in them, and be responsible, blameworthy, and culpable for them and their consequences.

What makes absence-omissions talk true, claims Clarke, might be no more than “the world as it is” or the fact that nothing exists to make it false (p. 44). The fact that we can count omissions (“my omission to turn out the lights was the second such omission by me this month” (p. 48)) suggests that omissions are entities. But Clarke says that the truth of such statements might be accounted for by the fact that there are no things of certain kinds at certain times and places, or such statements are false (but with true “replacements”, such as that “there are two distinct occasions this month . . . on each of which I omitted to turn out the lights” (p. 49)). And the fact that we can distinguish between different omissions might come to no more than the normative facts that ground omissions (such as the fact that Clarke was supposed to buy milk on his way home, but also supposed to pick up the dry cleaning) (p. 50). As for the fact that refrainings appear to have properties (refraining can be easy or difficult, for example), this too can be accounted for by the existence of pertinent facts that are not themselves about absences (p. 51).

Sometimes, though, we talk of omissions (e.g., to get the milk) resulting from one’s being distracted or from one’s starting to think about something else. Does this mean that omissions exist inasmuch as effects of causal processes exist? For Clarke, the answer is no. What happens in such cases is that the cause (e.g., the fact of being distracted) produces further activities (e.g., continuing to drive) that are incompatible with doing what one was supposed to do (according to the relevant norm, standard, or ideal). This is what our loose talk of distraction “causing” the omission to purchase milk amounts to. As for omissions serving as causes, Clarke offers us replacement counterfactuals. For example, the fact that Clarke’s wife’s disappointment results from his omission to get the milk amounts to no more than that if he had concentrated on what he needed to do instead of getting distracted, then his wife wouldn’t have been disappointed. It is in this way that we can make sense of the causal relevance of omissions to their “results”, even if we accept, for a variety of metaphysical reasons closely related to their status as non-entities, that omissions can’t be causes or effects (p. 56). As to whether omissions really can serve as causes or effects, Clarke is “noncommittal”, on the grounds that he has no theory of causation to offer (p. 58).

Clarke’s discussion of intentional omissions, or refrainings, is a fascinating excursion in the theory of action. He denies that intentionally omitting to A requires that one intentionally perform some action B while believing that one can’t both B and A at the same time, and denies that intentionally omitting to A requires that one have decided not to A (p. 63). More controversially, Clarke also denies that intentionally omitting to A requires having, at some relevant time, an intention not to A (p. 66 ff.). Understandably, though, Clarke insists that the mere desire not to A combined with awareness that one is not A-ing is not sufficient for intentionally omitting to A (p. 68). The view on which Clarke settles is that in order to intentionally omit to A one must have an intention with some relevant content (but not necessarily the content: not to A) that (non-deviantly) causes some of one’s subsequent conduct that is incompatible with one’s A-ing. This is similar (but not perfectly parallel) to the thesis in the philosophy of action that in order to intentionally A one must have the intention to A, and the latter intention must (non-deviantly) cause one’s A-ing. This theory, argues Clarke, is consistent both with the view (perhaps one based on a counterfactual theory of causation) that omissions can be causes and effects and with the view that omissions can’t be causes or effects because they are non-entities.

On his way to discussing the conditions under which we might be morally responsible for omissions, Clarke asks how omissions, abilities, and freedom are interrelated. Clarke argues that lack of ability (whether in the form of paralysis, or lack of opportunity, or some such) can sometimes make it impossible to omit. If I intended to go to the store and then later forgot, but I wouldn’t have been able to go anyway (because I was, unbeknownst to me, paralyzed, or because my car battery was dead), then I did not omit to go even if I did fail to go. However, Clarke argues, it is also sometimes possible to omit to act even when one lacks motor control over the action, if the motor control were restored if one attempted to so act (p. 93). Similarly, it is possible to refrain from acting even if one lacks the ability to avoid having intended to so act (p. 94). Beyond this Clarke argues that there are various aspects of freedom that can be present in the case of refrainings, in which case one freely refrains: the normal causal role played by intentions in such cases, freedom from various kinds of unfreedom (delusion, compulsion, manipulation, and so on), and the ability to do otherwise (p. 97). (Similarly for mere omissions, leaving out the normal causal role of intentions.) And, he argues, in some cases a kind of ability not to act might be an important aspect of one’s freely performing an action (p. 104).

Clarke distinguishes between basic and derived (moral) responsibility. One has derived responsibility for X when X is the result of something for which one is responsible. If one is responsible for X but one’s responsibility for X is not derived, then one’s responsibility for X is basic. Clarke claims not only that one can have basic responsibility for omissions that are themselves negative or positive actions (such as holding one’s body still), but also (here disagreeing with Robert Kane) that one can have basic responsibility for mere omissions (such as the omission to pick up the milk on his way home). Clarke’s (admittedly somewhat skeletal) proposal is that one has basic responsibility for omitting to A just in case one freely omits to A (p. 116). Beyond this, Clarke proposes that it is sufficient for one to have derived responsibility for X that X be the “result” (in the technical sense describe above) of some omission for which one has basic responsibility (pp. 133-134). Along the way, Clarke criticizes Fischer and Ravizza’s influential guidance-control account of responsibility for omissions and their consequences (pp. 119-132).

What is the relation between responsibility for an action/omission and the ability to do otherwise? So-called “Frankfurt” cases, as Clarke points out (pp. 136-138), strongly suggest that one’s being responsible for action A does not require that one have the ability not to do A. But is the same thesis true for omissions? If so, then there is a certain symmetry between actions and omissions in respect of the relation between responsibility and the ability to do otherwise. If not, then there is asymmetry instead. Here Clarke canvasses arguments for asymmetry (pp. 143-150 — focusing on Carolina Sartorio’s work) and arguments for symmetry (pp. 150-153), concluding that although a decent case can be made for the existence of Frankfurt inaction cases, the question remains “uncertain” (p. 153).

Interestingly, Clarke claims that attributions of responsibility are “intensional”: “One can be responsible for something described one way but not responsible for that thing described another way” (p. 158). It follows that, in those cases in which omissions are identical to negative or positive acts, it can happen that an agent is and is not responsible for the very same omission (depending on whether it is described as, say, a “holding still” or as a “not moving”).

Clarke considers an interesting argument for skepticism about negligent action, that is, “an inadvertent wrongful deed for which the agent is blameworthy” (p. 160). The argument assumes that (B) “one is blameworthy for wrongdoing done from ignorance only if one is blameworthy for that ignorance” (p. 162). It is then argued that one is rarely “blameworthy for the ignorance in which one does wrong” (p. 161). Skepticism about most instances of purported negligence then follows (see Michael Zimmerman, Neil Levy, and Gideon Rosen). In response, Clarke suggests, and describes hypothetical scenarios that support, the following account of blameworthiness (B*):

Provided that the agent has the capacities which make her a morally responsible agent, she is blameworthy for [a wrongful omission that isn’t intentional and of which she is unaware] if she is free in failing [to do] the thing in question and if her lack of awareness of her obligation to do it — and of the fact that she isn’t doing it — falls below a cognitive standard that applies to her, given her cognitive and volitional abilities and the situation she is in. (p. 167)

On this account, Clarke argues, principle (B) is false, and the skeptical argument fails. Clarke doesn’t take himself to have shown that (B*) is true, but he outlines its theoretical advantages, and offers it as a “challenge” to which it would behoove the skeptic to offer a response (p. 183).

Finally, Clarke claims that there are aspects of criminal law or tort law that hinge on moral responsibility for omissions. In those cases, there is often legal liability where there is moral responsibility. This happens, for example, when a bad outcome is the (technical) “result” of an omission for which someone is morally responsible, even if the omission can’t be said to have caused the bad outcome (pp. 206-207); and it happens when there is basic responsibility for an omission that isn’t intentional and of which one is unaware (pp. 207-209).

Many parts of this book deserve extended discussion. We regret that we only have the space here to briefly discuss a few of them.

With respect to the nature of omissions, Clarke claims that we would not ordinarily describe a failure to act as an omission unless there is some norm, standard, or ideal that calls for one to act. The following question naturally arises: what sorts of norms, standards, or ideals count here? Clarke takes it that the boundaries of our ordinary concept are not sharp (p. 32) and so remains explicitly noncommital on the question of, say, whether a failure to act out of a habit, in particular, counts as an omission. But at this point, we might ask whether we should want a definitive answer if we are to make general claims about omissions in moral and legal contexts. If, as seems plausible, the ordinary concept of omissions does not have sharp boundaries, then perhaps we ought to prefer either a sharpened version of the ordinary concept or a more general category to which they belong when it comes to moral and legal questions.

Clarke argues that some omissions are (negative or positive) acts, while others are non-entities. The category of omission, then, is intrinsically disjunctive. Viewed from one perspective, this is potentially theoretically unsatisfying, for one might have thought that there is something that all omissions have in common, something that makes them omissions rather than something else. But Clarke claims that disjunctivism is supported by two sorts of considerations: (1) the fact that some refrainings (namely refraining from refraining to act) are clearly acts, and (2) the fact that omitting to move is identical to holding still. But both (1) and (2) might be questioned. It appears, first, that it is possible to refrain from refraining to A without actually A’ing. It seems to us that Clara might decide not to refrain from calling her brother, but just as she picks up the phone she gets distracted and doesn’t call. In such a case, Clara arguably refrains from refraining to call her brother without calling her brother. And, second, if omitting to move is holding still, then omitting to omit to move should be omitting to hold still. But, as Clarke sees it, omitting to omit to move is the same as moving. So moving should be the same as omitting to hold still. But it seems that there are cases, such as ones in which one is very relaxed (and immobile), in which one omits to hold still and yet fails to move. The desirability of theoretical unity then pushes toward the view that there are really no omissions that are properly characterized as acts of some sort: all omissions are absences.

On the other hand, if omissions are absences, and absences are non-entities, then some of Clarke’s arguments in defense of the view are problematic. For Clarke appeals to Leibniz’s Law to argue that some omissions are not actions, claiming, for example, that whereas a child’s holding still might be difficult, her not leaping and shouting isn’t at all so, and hence the child’s refraining from leaping and shouting should not be identified with her holding still (pp. 25-26). But if the child’s refraining from leaping and shouting is quite literally a non-entity, it is difficult to understand how one could truly predicate lack of difficulty of it, in such a way as to sustain an argument based on Leibniz’s Law. Indeed, if, as Clarke himself suggests, a refraining’s having a certain property amounts to no more than the existence of facts that are not themselves about absences, then it becomes impossible to use a Leibniz’s Law argument to show that the refraining is not identical to this or that.

And the fact that omissions are absences threatens Clarke’s ecumenicalism with respect to whether omissions are genuine causes/effects or merely result in, or are the result of, actions or omissions. For if omissions really don’t exist (they are non-entities), then they really can’t be causes or effects, unless the causal relation isn’t a relation between entities. At one point, Clarke suggests that the question whether omissions can be causes/effects is just a matter of semantics, of how one chooses to talk (in terms of causes or in terms of “results”). But the metaphysics of omissions combined with the right metaphysics of causation here may require Clarke to commit where he would prefer to remain non-committal.

Let us turn now to the question of whether the ability to do otherwise is required for moral responsibility for omissions. As Clarke points out, there are cases (first introduced by Fischer and Ravizza) that suggest that moral responsibility requires the ability to do what one omits to do. In Sharks, John sees a child struggling in the water, believes that he could easily rescue the child, but decides not to bother. However, there are sharks in the water who would have eaten John if he had decided to jump in to save the child. But other cases suggest to some that moral responsibility is compatible with the inability to do otherwise. In Sloth, which is a Frankfurt case of inaction, John sees a child struggling in the water, believes that he could easily rescue the child, and decides not to bother. But this time, had John given serious thought to saving the child, someone monitoring his thoughts would have made him decide not to bother. Some philosophers think that John is morally responsible for his failure to save the child in Sloth even though he could not have saved the child. Clarke thinks that a decent case can be made for this position. He points out that there are clear parallels between Frankfurt action cases and Frankfurt inaction cases. This suggests that if agents are morally responsible in the former, then they are also morally responsible in the latter. But he also provides an argument for the position, one based on what he sees as a relevant difference between Sharks and Sloth. In Sloth, Clarke says, “John intentionally doesn’t save the child”; but “it isn’t clear that this is so in Sharks” (p. 152). However, this difference (if it is in fact a difference) between Sharks and Sloth appears explanatorily otiose, even by Clarke’s own lights. What explains the fact that John is not responsible in Sharks is that “no matter what John had intended, and no matter how hard he might have tried, he wouldn’t have been able to save the child” (p. 153). The fact that John does not intentionally fail to save the child in Sharks plays no role in this explanation. And, indeed, as Clarke argues elsewhere (for example, in the milk case), it is possible for one to be morally responsible for not doing A even when one doesn’t intentionally not do A. So, for Clarke at least, it looks like it is the truth or falsity of counterfactuals connecting decisions and outcomes that determines the truth or falsity of attributions of moral responsibility for omissions. And this raises a question worth thinking about: what is it about the truth of these counterfactuals that supports attributions of moral responsibility?

Finally, with respect to negligent action, we find Clarke’s account of blameworthiness (that is, principle (B*)) intriguing. The picture, roughly, is that it is sufficient for one to be blameworthy in a basic way for an unwitting omission that one be free with respect to the omission and that one’s lack of awareness of one’s obligation and of the fact that one is failing to discharge it falls below some cognitive standard that applies to one, given one’s situation and one’s cognitive and volitional abilities. Here we have questions about how the relevant standard is supposed to be fixed. At one point (p. 166), Clarke suggests that the standard is fixed (at least in part) by the percentage of one’s past success. If one usually remembers to stop for milk, then that helps fix the standard that applies to one when one uncharacteristically forgets one day to stop for milk. But now imagine that Keisha has a normal and quite good capacity to remember, one that she just happens not to have exercised often. It seems odd to say that Keisha is off the moral hook merely by virtue of the fact that the cognitive standard that applies to her is so low that it is virtually impossible for anyone to fall below it.

Our second question is how to reconcile this account with Clarke’s earlier (and plausible) claim that to be responsible in a sense associated with appropriate responses of so-called “reactive attitudes” such as resentment and guilt and with justified sanction for the violation of obligation requires having a certain kind of control. Is it possible to offer a positive characterization of the notion of control possessed by an unwitting omitter who meets the conditions Clarke sets out for responsibility? In his earlier discussion of freely omitting, Clarke offers reason to think that there must be some kind of control in such cases (pp. 111- 115), insofar as we take people to be directly responsible for omissions in this robust way and insofar as we take it that such responsibility requires control. Further, he points out that in the milk case, forgetting to stop for the milk leaves open that “it remains up to me whether I get the milk” (p. 115). But it is not obvious in what sense it is up to him to stop for the milk in the case. And the question for us now is whether the conditions offered as sufficient for blameworthiness for an unwitting omission illuminate this sense of control. It is not clear to us that they add anything to the previous claim that it can be up to us whether to do the thing we unwittingly omit to do. Falling below a standard, while important, seems on the surface to be unrelated to control, for example. So we are left with a question of whether it is possible to further explicate the sense of control we manage to possess in such cases.

We have raised some questions and criticisms here, but we would like to close with an encomium. In clear and very readable prose, Clarke raises a number of fascinating issues at the intersection of many philosophical subfields, and his discussion of them displays a host of virtues. Where he thinks he has a strong argument or a counterexample, he says so. But he is also refreshingly humble and distinctly concerned about not going beyond what he thinks the evidence of intuition and argument supports. Combining, as it does, clever moves with illuminating cases, and all without a hint of arrogance or posturing, the book is a rewarding read and a very valuable contribution to the literature on the nature of, and moral and legal responsibility for, omissions and their consequences.