On Architecture

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Fred Rush, On Architecture, Routledge, 2009, 178pp., $19.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780415396196.

Reviewed by James Dodd, New School for Social Research



Fred Rush has written a lucid, engaging essay on architectural theory and practice. Among its many merits is that it is limited to being neither a pure work of aesthetic theory, nor one of architectural criticism, nor a manifesto for a future architecture, though there is much here that could be employed in the pursuit of any of these projects. Rush writes with a formidable knowledge of classical aesthetics, does not shy away from taking a critical stand on a number of modern and contemporary buildings, and argues persuasively for the value of a phenomenologically inspired architecture. Still, this book is more about engaging, in the spirit of the series Thinking in Action, a broad audience on important questions of architecture than presenting a theory or taking a particular critical stand.

This generalist orientation of the text does not detract from its sophistication, however. Take the theme of experience: Rush takes his bearings from the basic, if perhaps not simple, fact that when we employ the term “architecture” we are, at least in part, referring to the built-world as something “experienced”. This focus on experience in “On Architecture” takes a very specific form: the point is not to provide a general account of the experience of the built world, though much of the resources that Rush employs in his reflections, such as the phenomenological philosophy of Merleau-Ponty in Chapter One, or his treatment of the complex debates on urbanism in Chapter Three, or even the wonderful passages on the role of architecture in film that one finds in Chapter Two, would certainly be relevant for such a project. Rush instead formulates the question of experience in terms of how one might build, were one to build with “experience in mind” (p. ix). To be sure, the architect always has, at least implicitly, some experience or other in mind, at least to the extent that a reflection on any human activity is in part a reflection on its being-experienced. This is the case even if, for whatever reason, the architect designs without any specific aesthetic response as a goal, perhaps using prefabricated designs towards the achievement of a particular end. The activity itself brings the necessity of experience as a theme. For example, a sidewalk is built with walking in mind. What walking through a given layout of avenues or orders of passages gives access to, can in turn be conceived only if the being-experienced of the activity of walking and access also takes shape in reflection, even if only implicitly. If we broaden what is in view here to include the widest scope of what is manifest in the visibility of things, one might simply call this experience-dimension the “aesthetics” of the space, broadly construed as the sum of subjective responses solicited by a given structure: what we “see” when we encounter it. But this would risk being an instance of, as Rush might put it, an “undertheorizing” of experience, one that fails to appreciate the role of the fact that we not only “experience” the things of experience, but we also experience experiencing itself, as an implicit theme that plays a crucial role in orchestrating just how it is that we encounter things in the world. This is, I would suggest, a rather sophisticated idea, and Rush does a good job of exploring it without employing too many academic instruments of professional philosophy that would make the discussion inaccessible to most.

Rush is interested in just what “architecture” would look like, were one to conceive of building from a more robust appreciation of what we might call the experiencing of experience. Again, one should point out that Rush does not provide us here with a general account of the built world (or of experience, for that matter), since in the end he is predominantly interested in how such an architecture is to be apprehended ultimately as an aesthetic object. In this respect Rush’s discussion is rather traditional, in that he sees the philosopher’s contribution to a discourse on architecture to be either aesthetic or ethical, something that in fact corresponds to the division of the book. Chapter One, “Bodies and Architectural Space”, outlines the basic concepts of a phenomenological architecture, while Chapters Two (“Architecture and Other Arts”) and Three (“Buildings, Buildings and More Buildings”) deal with the significance of these concepts with respect to aesthetics and the ethics of urban design, respectively. Let us take each of these in turn.

Drawing principally from Merleau-Ponty, the approach to architecture that Rush has in mind is tied to the theme of embodiment. The idea is that, against what Rush calls the approach of “historical inter-textuality” and “semiological” approaches to understanding architectural form, it is possible to approach the built as a means of expressing structures and modalities of human bodily comportment (pp. 4-5). This is an extension of a philosophical thesis — that our awareness of our experiencing just is our awareness of our embodiment — into a reflection on architectural aesthetics, via the insight that the expressive force of the build-world folds back (“loops back”, p. 4) into our experiencing itself, raising it to a heightened awareness of itself and, perhaps, in such a way that shapes embodied experiencing. The principal figure in contemporary architecture that Rush discusses here is Steven Holl, who employs phenomenologically inspired notions of “intertwining”, parallax, and the primacy of haptic experience in the generation of architectural forms that seek to play on the multiplicity of the dimensions of bodily experience in complex, synthetic ways (pp. 36-38). Rush offers a first person descriptive analysis of Holl’s aesthetics in a consideration of the Nelson-Atkins Museum extension project in Kansas City, Missouri. His analysis culminates in the interesting idea that architectural structures that seek to engage the subject in the full dimensionality of bodily experience tend to develop, in a striking fashion, a form of recursive sensitivity, “similar to the way that being sensitive to oneself and one’s relation to one’s particular life paths is thought indicative of humans” (p. 46).

This bodily reflexivity, and the complex morphology that constitutes the perceptual experience of structures such as Holl’s Nelson-Atkins extension or Frank Gehry’s Guggenheim Museum at Bilbao, which graces the cover of On Architecture, put such a phenomenological aesthetics at odds with the dominant tendency in classical aesthetics to put a premium on representation when evaluating the nature of the expressivity of the plastic arts. Such structures are meant to be read neither as symbols, nor understood as images; they are meant to happen, to be approached in terms of the logic of events and not of the decipherment of signs. The theme of bodily reflexivity in turn sheds light on that other traditional source for the disqualification of architecture as art — its unavoidable association with use, interest, and utility. Though now the focus is not so much on the constitutive role of a goal or an end in the perception of form, which had from Kant on always been suspected of distorting the aesthetic impact of the work of art, as on the corporal comportments necessary to make the use of a structure emerge from form into view at all — think again of that sidewalk, which is neither an image nor a symbol of walking, but a given conduit of purposiveness that can be engaged only on foot, as it were. “Art” understood from this perspective now has as much to do with the conditions of encounterability as it does with the establishment of a formed, shaped entity that bears a certain representative or purely aesthetic content.

To explore the implications of this perspective, Rush employs two interesting strategies in Chapter Two, apart from pointing to some obvious points of comparison between modern sculpture and modern architecture (here Richard Serra’s work is notable, where huge, twisting bands of steel shape and form an explicitly ambulatory environment that plays not on the embodiment of image or symbol in matter, but on a haptic, visual engagement with the weight, balance, and grace of the steel itself). The first is a reflection on the architecture of the museum, that is, structures that have to do explicitly with orchestrating our encounter with works of art. Here the idea that architecture, as a medium of expression, develops in unique and indispensible ways the problem of what it means to encounter a “work of art” becomes quite plausible, though it is sometimes obscured in Rush’s discussion of museums such as the Guggenheim (whether in New York or Bilbao) or the Uffizi, which not only exhibit but seem to compete with the collections displayed in them. Nevertheless, an important point is suggested here, though not fully explored: if the “aesthetic” effect of a work of art is not to be limited to a given, finite subjective reaction to the form of an object, but instead represents an opening of possibilities of exploration that occur in accordance with the incomplete yet unfolding “life paths” of the corporeal-perceptual event as such, then perhaps this inscription/display of works of art in architecture (whether it be the museum, the cathedral, the public square, or the home) is of capital importance.

The second strategy in Chapter Two is really a suggestion. Picking up on Schelling’s famous definition of architecture as “frozen music”, and taking Gehry’s Walt Disney Concert Hall as an example, Rush suggests an interesting way to depart from the prejudice according to which architecture, unlike music or theater, is something static, as if representing a triumph of gravity and materiality over transcendence and spirit (pp. 96-100). Gehry’s concert hall, Rush argues, is not static in an absolute sense, but stands in an inner relation to the music performed within it. Rush however also emphasizes the relation of the hall to the inevitable tendencies for the body to respond to the music, to in short dance. Rush’s point is that the building complements this relation of the body to the music played in the hall, and as such could be said to belong organically to the event of the performance, a belonging that takes the explicit form of a dance. Not that the building dances; Schelling is right, it is frozen. Nevertheless it does inhabit a space between music and body that is patterned and structured in accordance with everything that gives dance its form, and in that sense its very materiality needs to be understood in terms of a conception of “movement” robust enough to capture its unique play of presence — it may be frozen, but it is still frozen music.

This brings us to the potential for phenomenology to contribute to ethical debates about how we ought to build. Rush proceeds here (Chapter Three) a bit more cautiously: he recognizes that this association of architecture with experience suggests the potential of essentially programming the latter out of the technical resources of the former (pp. 120-121). This is the idea behind many large-scale urban renewal projects, past and present, which seek not only to orchestrate a revitalized city life, but to shape the nature of the lives that unfold in that particular space. Rush is very suspicious of the idea of “total architecture” as it was pursued by Gropius, Wright, and Le Courbousier, but he is not immune to the idea that value can be generated through the medium of the built-world, or that we can have a positive impact on ourselves through our technical mastery of the artificial environment in which we find ourselves situated — whether, as Rush puts it, this value increases intensively, “by drawing one deeper and deeper into the given environment”, thus forming a countermovement against alienation in the form of homelessness, or extensively, in the quantitative expansion of the horizon of experience: “the more types one experiences (and the more one experiences their disjunction) the more one experiences, full stop” (p. 123).

This is so, of course, if we take “experience” to be itself a value, a kind of spiritual capital that, if well enough invested or developed, would bring us the rewards of a better life. Here perhaps one feels the absence of a more general account of a phenomenology of the built-world. We need to ask just in what sense building a world constructs experience, and how the problem of selfhood ought to be articulated when discussing these matters of architecture. We need, as Hannah Arendt might say, to bring into view the peculiar human problems that are germane to the production of the edifice of our lives — whether they are problems that are addressed by our capacity to make, or problems that this capacity does not address but only intensifies. If among the activities of homo faber we are to include the construction of experiences, or of a pattern of materiality that intensifies and expands experience as a quantity of life, that does not necessarily mean that we have the ability to build a world of meaning or value.

That being said, Rush’s book is an excellent place to begin just such a discussion.