On Aristotle Physics 1-3

Placeholder book cover

Themistius, On Aristotle Physics 1-3, Robert B. Todd (tr.), Bristol Classical Press, 2012, 222pp., $130.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780715639221.

Reviewed by Andrea Falcon, Concordia University, Montreal


With this volume, Robert Todd completes his translation of the paraphrase of Aristotle's Physics by Themistius (fourth century AD). Two other installments have already appeared in the Ancient Commentators on Aristotle Series directed by Richard Sorabji: Themistius, On Aristotle Physics 4, and Themistius, On Aristotle Physics 5-8.[1] Following the standard practice of the series, these volumes contain an English translation followed by a set of endnotes. The translation is based on the Greek text established by Heinrich Schenkl (Commentaria in Aristotelem Graeca 5.2, Berlin 1900). Robert Todd, however, does not hesitate to improve on Schenkl's text. The volume under review contains over 300 emendations. A roughly equivalent number of emendations is recorded for the translation of the paraphrase of Physics 5-8. The paraphrase of Physics 4 registers approximately half as many textual changes. In some cases, these emendations accept variant readings attested in the manuscript tradition. In other cases, they are based on the indirect tradition. Themistius was an authority in late antiquity. His paraphrase was quoted by Simplicius and Philoponus (sixth century AD), so both commentators can be used as witnesses for the text of the paraphrase. Last but not least, Todd also adopts some of the readings printed in the 1866 edition by Leonhard Spengel.[2] The departures from Schenkl's text are collected in a list of emendations at the beginning of each volume. Moreover, they are fully explained in the notes at the end of the translation. This level of engagement with the Greek text goes emphatically beyond what is normally expected from a translator. It makes this translation an especially welcome addition to those already published in the Ancient Commentators on Aristotle Series.

While the focus of this review will be the paraphrase of Aristotle's Physics 1-3, I will comment on the whole of Themistius' paraphrase, beginning with a few words on its nature and goal. Themistius may not have been the first to write paraphrases of Aristotle's writings (Andronicus of Rhodes is said "to have paraphrased the Categories"),[3] but he was certainly the one who raised this form of exegetical exercise to a new level of sophistication, setting a standard for the subsequent tradition. A paraphrase is a restatement of the original text with the primary goal of offering "not a simple summary or epitome but a definition of the sense of the Aristotelian original expressed in an authorial voice that mostly purports to be that of Aristotle himself offering, as it were, an alternative and usually more expansive version of his own text" (1). In the case of Aristotle's Physics, the final result is a critical treatment of the text that rearranges the original train of thought, unpacks the argument, condenses and simplifies the exposition, as well as occasionally adds notes and digressions. It is a result that is best appreciated by readers already familiar with the Aristotelian text. The paraphrase is in fact

targeted at readers who wished to revisit Aristotelian treatises with which they were already familiar and were pitched at a level somewhere between earlier expansive commentaries (notably those of Alexander of Aphrodisias, fl. c. AD 200) and strictly elementary expositions. (On Aristotle Physics 4, Introduction, p. 1)

At the most general level, the structure of the paraphrase mirrors that of the original work.

The paraphrase of Aristotle's Physics is no exception to the rule. It too is divided into eight books. The restatement of the first four books is approximately twice the length of the Aristotelian text and is occasionally supplemented with additional material coming from the exegetical tradition. For instance, the analysis of change offered in Physics 1.7 is enriched with a note on the distinction between prime matter and the underlying subject of change (hupokeimenonon). Also, Aristotle's treatment of time in Physics 4 is updated with a response to the objections of Boethus of Sidon (first century BC) and Galen (second century AD). It is fairly clear that these additions are not to be considered innovations by Themistius. Quite the contrary, Themistius is writing as part of an exegetical tradition he has fully absorbed and critically elaborated. In both cases, he must have considered the additional material an integral part of the discussion (and the teaching) of the Physics.

If the paraphrase of the first four books of Aristotle's Physics ends up being more expansive than Aristotle's original, the restatement of the last four books contains some remarkable omissions. The most obvious example of Themistius' selective approach to the Aristotelian text is to be found in his paraphrase of Physics 7. The restatement of this book begins with the claim that everything that changes is changed by itself or by another thing. Yet, this is a claim Aristotle introduces only after he has argued -- in Physics 7.1 -- for the thesis that everything that is changed is changed by something. Interestingly enough, Themistius ignores the whole chapter. In all probability, he considered it a not completely successful (and hence expendable) defense of the thesis that everything that changes is changed by something. This summary approach to the text of Physics 7 is in line with the ancient perception of the book. We know that even within the Aristotelian tradition the whole book, and in particular its opening chapter, was perceived as advancing arguments that fall short of the rigorous standards of Aristotelian science.[4]

So much for the macrostructure of Themistius' paraphrase. One of the great virtues of Robert Todd's translation is that the reader is not only introduced to the most general features of the paraphrase but is also allowed to study its microstructure, which is to say the particular decisions and choices made by Themistius in interacting with the Aristotelian text. To this end, the translation is divided into sections that are precisely correlated to the Aristotelian text. For each of these sections, in Todd's translation, we are given the Bekker numbers, which are the standard form of reference to the Aristotelian text. In this way, we are able to see in detail how Themistius engaged critically with Aristotle's Physics. The final result is an in-depth examination of Themistius' method as an interpreter (exêgetês) of Aristotle.

This method is not the result of the mechanical application of a few exegetical rules which can be spelled out in advance for the reader. Hence there is no substitute for a full immersion in the paraphrase. Here I am content to give one representative example of Themistius' approach taken from the volume under review: his exegetical commitment to the existence of prime matter. This commitment is introduced in connection with the analysis of change in Physics 1.7. We have already seen that Themistius expands on the Aristotelian text with the distinction between prime matter and the underlying subject of change. This commitment is reaffirmed at the very end of the paraphrase of Physics 1, where Themistius reports the Aristotelian claim that matter is the first underlying subject (prôton hupokeimenon) from the presence of which each thing comes to be. While the Aristotelian text can be taken to be about proximate matter, this reading is not available to us in the paraphrase by Themistius. Why? Because Themistius has already equated the first underlying subject with that which can receive every shape and is deprived of every shape, namely prime matter. Therefore we can only take Themistius to mean that matter is the ultimate underlying subject from the presence of which each thing comes to be.[5]

As a result of his exegetical decision to adopt not only the style but also the persona of Aristotle, Themistius is barred from engaging in an extensive discussion of the connections between thePhysics and other Aristotelian works. At most, he can make them explicit. Here is one example taken from the volume under review. Physics 1 contains a reply to those who deny the existence of change. For Aristotle, this reply is external to the science of nature. It is however a reply that is worth giving, as the argument against the existence of change contributes to knowledge. Interestingly enough, Aristotle's reply presupposes the ontology presented in the Categories. Scholars have often wondered how fair and effective this reply can be, given that his opponents are not likely to accept this ontology. But Aristotle is not just responding to a challenge coming from outside the study of nature; he is also making a point about the sort of ontology which must be in place in order to engage in an optimal study of nature. In his restatement of the Aristotelian text, Themistius makes the reference to the Categories explicit:

the most relevant starting point of all is to say what does 'what is' signify for them [sc. those who deny change]. Do they think that it is said in many ways, or in only one? If in many ways, then, as we have demonstrated in the Categories, they would be saying that what is is one in name but many in subsistence.[6]

Themistius is also barred from launching into a direct discussion of important structural questions such as the unity and argument of the Physics as a whole. But this does not mean that Themistius is not interested in these questions, or that he has no answer to them. Consider how Themistius reworks the opening lines of Physics 8.3. Aristotle says that the goal of the investigation (pragmateia) is to show that there are three types of things (which are also three modes of being with respect to motion): while some are not subject to motion, others are always in motion, and still others partake of both motion and rest. When Themistius restates this passage, he says that the goal of the investigation on change (pragmateia peri kinêseôs) is to show that there are the three types of things mentioned above. This small addition is not insignificant. It suggests that Themistius endorsed the view that Physics 8 is part of a larger investigation on change.[7] We do not know how large this investigation was for Themistius. More specifically, we do not know whether he considered Physics 5-8 a single unit on the topic of change, or whether he endorsed the view that there are three books on change.[8] Still, it is clear that he regarded Physics 8 as the culmination of an argument unfolding over several books.

Here is another example taken from his paraphrase of Physics 2. The opening sentence runs as follows: "Now in making a new beginning more appropriate to the present inquiry let us try to define just what it is that we call nature." Again, Themistius is going emphatically beyond what we read in the original text. Whereas Aristotle opens Physics 2 without making contact with the investigation conducted in Physics 1, Themistius indicates that there is continuity as well as discontinuity between the two books. By his lights, both contribute to the same inquiry. In all probability, this is the inquiry concerning the principles of nature announced in the opening chapter of Physics 1. Physics 2 is also concerned with the principles of nature. But it deals with the principles of nature starting from the definition of nature as a principle and cause of change and rest. As soon as this definition is in place, the study of the principles continues with a study of matter and form.[9]

The above examples illustrate what Robert Todd has identified as the strengths as well as the weaknesses of the paraphrastic method. In his words, this method gives us a "permanently usefulentrée to a difficult text" [On Aristotle Physics 4, Introduction, p. 1]. The final result is "an Aristotelian text upgraded to allow ambitious readers to advance to more elaborate exegetical material and leave less ambitious readers (apparently the target audience) with better access to the details of the text" (3). Still, the paraphrase cannot (and is not meant to) compete with the philosophical commentary. It is to this other, more expansive, form of exegesis that the ambitious reader is expected to turn for an extensive discussion of the interpretative issues raised by the Aristotelian text.

I have already indicated that the level of engagement with the Greek text makes this translation an especially welcome addition to the Ancient Commentators on Aristotle Series. I would like to add that it is also a remarkably accurate translation. With the help of the Greek-English glossary at the end of each volume, it can be used as a reliable guide to the study of the how Themistius engaged critically with the text of Aristotle's Physics. The notes at the end of the translation are always informative and to the point. Scholars working on Aristotle's Physics will find this fine translation a very valuable research tool.


[1]Here is the full information: On Aristotle's Physics 4. Translated by Robert B. Todd. Cornell University Press, 2003. Pp.150, ISBN 0-8014-4103-X; On Aristotle's Physics 5-8. Translated by Robert B. Todd. Gerald Duckworth & Co., 2008. Pp. 198, ISBN, 978-07156-36640.

[2] L. Spengel, Themistii Paraphrases Aristotelis Librorum quae Supersunt. Leipzig 1866.

[3]Simplicius, On Aristotle's Categories 29.28-30.5. But it is far from clear that Simplicius is not projecting his own exegetical standards onto Andronicus (first century BC).

[4]Alexander of Aphrodisias, who wrote in the late second and early third century AD, defended the book as a whole but admitted that it contained logical (i.e., dialectical) arguments. Our source of information is Simplicius, On Aristotle's Physics 7, 1036.8-12. Simplicius takes Themistius' summary treatment of Physics 7 as evidence that the latter shared Alexander's view.

[5]The exegetical commitment is at work also in the paraphrase of Physics 2. Themistius finds a reference to prime matter in Physics 2, 193 a 29: "the first matter that is an underlying subject for each thing."

[6]As a consequence of the fact that Themistius does not distinguish himself from Aristotle, it is not clear whether Themistius is referring to Aristotle's Categories or to his (now lost) paraphrase of the Categories. See the note 58 at the end of our volume.

[7]Todd is skeptical about the significance of this addition. See Themistius, On Aristotle Physics 5-8, Introduction, note 5.

[8]The view that Physics 5-8 is a single unit on change goes back to Porphyry (third century AD). The majority of ancient scholars divided the Physics at the end of book 5. By their lights, the books on change are three: Physics 6-8.

[9]Cf. the opening sentence of the paraphrase of Physics 2.3: "Regarding the principles and elements let what has been stated stand." With this sentence Themistius indicates that the discussion of matter and form as principles of nature is concluded.