Aspects of Psychologism

Placeholder book cover

Tim Crane, Aspects of Psychologism, Harvard University Press, 2014, 368pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780674724570.

Reviewed by Farid Masrour, University of Wisconsin-Madison


This is a collection of essays written between 1992 and 2012. They cover a broad range of topics about intentionality, including its nature, its role in the philosophical study of the mind, the history of the concept, and its relation to perception and consciousness. Together, the essays develop and defend a unified outlook about intentionality that Tim Crane calls psychologism. His introduction, "In Defense of Psychologism" (2012), outlines this view, which is a collection of inter-related metaphysical and methodological theses. A central thesis of psychologism is that the mental is a "self-standing" part of reality that can be studied by conceptual analysis, phenomenology and empirical science. Moreover, it is intentionality that makes the mental a unified subject matter. It is the "defining characteristic" of the mental. Crane sees psychologism as militating against an anti-psychologistic attitude that he regards as the orthodoxy in contemporary analytic philosophy of mind. Anti-psychologism about intentionality combines the thesis that the central method for investigating the mind is conceptual analysis with the thesis that the correct way of understanding intentionality is in terms of truth and reference. Crane calls this latter view the semantic account of intentionality. The thesis that intentional contents have to be analyzed in terms of relations to propositions is, on his view, the principal version of the semantic account.

The book has four main parts. The first includes three historical essays about intentionality. The first of these, "Brentano's Concept of Intentional Inexistence" (2006), concerns the significance of the change from Brentano's early view that intentional objects are immanent to the act of thinking to the view that intentional objects transcend the act of thinking. This change, according to Crane, gives rise to the problem of intentionality, that is, the problem of accounting for how some intentional states could be directed at non-existent objects. The next essay, "Wittgenstein and Intentionality" (2010), argues against Wittgensteinian dissolutions of the problem of intentionality.In the section's last essay, "The Origins of Qualia" (2000). Crane distinguishes between intentionalist and non-intentionalist readings of qualia and argues that the original conception that drove philosophers to qualia was an intentionalist conception. This is in contrast to the recent orthodoxy that sees qualia as intrinsic properties.

Part II contains four essays that give Crane's general outlook on intentionality and its relation to consciousness. In "Intentionality as the Mark of the Mental" (1998) and "Intentionalism" (2009), Crane argues that intentionality is the mark of the mental and that the mind is a unified subject matter in virtue of intentionality. Accordingly, all mental states are intentional states. On his view, intentionality should be characterized in phenomenological/psychological terms, as the directedness of the mind towards its subject matter. Crane contrasts this characterization with grammatical criteria such as being embedded in non-truth functional contexts or the failure of the inter-substitutivity of co-referential terms. Later in the book it becomes clear that this characterization also contrasts with relationalist conceptions of intentionality. Crane sees the problem of intentionality as emerging from a tension between our tendency to identify intentional objects with ordinary objects and our acceptance of the idea that there could be intentional states that are directed at non-existent objects. In "Intentional Objects" (2001) he outlines his solution to this problem. It consists in rejecting the idea that there is an ontological category of intentional objects. In "The Intentional Structure of Consciousness" (2003) Crane focuses on taxonomizing different views about the relationship between intentionality and consciousness. In "Intentionalism" he revises this taxonomy and defends the view that the phenomenal character of conscious states is determined by their "entire intentional nature" by which he means the combination of the intentional content of the state and its intentional mode.

The essays in Part III together defend the view that the content of perceptual experiences is non-relational, non-conceptual, and non-propositional. "The Non-conceptual Content of Experience" (1992), contains Crane's earlier argument against the view that perceptual experiences have conceptual content. In his introduction to Part III, Crane notes that although he does not agree with the letter of the argument, he still maintains its spirit, and as such he still accepts its conclusion. He revisits this issue in "The Given" (2012), where he focuses on the recent debate between John McDowell and Charles Travis about the myth of the given. Crane argues that considerations about the myth of the given do not motivate a conceptualist account of perceptual content. This essay, along with "Is There a Perceptual Relation?" (2006) and "Is Perception a Propositional Attitude?" (2009), also distinguishes between a state being constituted by a relation to propositional contents and the possibility of describing its content by propositions. Crane argues that perceptual experiences are not propositional attitudes, though propositions can be used to model their content. The main argument in "Is There a Perceptual Relation?" makes it clear that Crane's version of intentionalism is a non-relationalist version and concludes that the most important division in contemporary philosophy of mind is the distinction between relationalist and non-relationalist conceptions of experience.

The focus of Part IV is more on consciousness than intentionality. "Unconscious Belief and Conscious Thought" (2012), defends the view that thoughts are conscious but beliefs are not. "Subjective Facts" (2003), gives an interesting reading of Jackson's knowledge argument. On this reading, the argument does not establish the failure of physicalism; it only proves the existence of a specific type of knowledge that can only be had by those capable of conscious experience. Crane neither accepts nor rejects physicalism. But he holds that most recent attempts to save physicalism from anti-physicalist arguments fail. In "Papineau on Phenomenal Concepts" (2005), Crane argues against David Papineau's use of phenomenal concepts to defend physicalism, and in "Tye on Acquaintance and the Problem of Consciousness" (2012), rejects Michael Tye's appeal to acquaintance to do so. On Crane's view, whether there are phenomenal concepts or relations of acquaintance are interesting questions in themselves. But these questions do not have much bearing on the debate over physicalism.

This volume is a joy to read and provides a refreshing outlook on the topics that it covers. Crane masterfully sets up the dialectic context before introducing his own views. The big picture is never lost, and deep interconnections among apparently disparate theses are exposed. As a result, in addition to learning about Crane's views, these essays provide the reader with a deeper and broader understanding of some of the important lines of thought and controversies in recent philosophy of mind. I have learned much from this book and highly recommend it to anyone with an interest in contemporary philosophy of mind and its recent history. This said, I find some of the volume's central themes rather puzzling. What follows explains three of these themes.

The thesis that intentionality is not a relation is at the core of Crane's account. However, Crane also holds that all intentional states have intentional objects. In fact, on his view, it is a definitional truth that intentionality consists in the directedness of the mind toward a subject matter, that is, the intentional object of the intentional state. However, talk about directedness and having objects sounds relational. There is, therefore, an apparent tension here. If intentionality is essentially non-relational, how could it be definitional that all intentional states have an object? I think that there are several ways to understand the non-relationality thesis that would remove this tension. However, these solutions do not seem to be available to Crane. Let me elaborate.

The natural analysis of non-relationalism is that an intentional state consists in the instantiation of a monadic property by a subject or one of its states. How does this square with the thesis that all intentional states have an object? One option is to hold that intentionality consists in the instantiation of a specific class of monadic properties that can only be characterized with relational locutions, for example, "thinks-about-x"or "sees-y". But this move leaves our basic question unanswered. We still wonder why intentional properties could be only characterized by relational locutions. One possible answer is that it is in the nature of intentional properties that their instantiation brings about the existence of intentional objects. We thus get intentional objects, as it were, for free. But this view has the implication that intentional objects are immanent to intentional states, and Crane explicitly rejects this view. A second answer is that there is something about the grammar of intentional discourse that imposes this constraint on monadic intentional properties. However, this solution also seems to be unavailable to Crane. For, in his polemic against Wittgensteinian views, he also explicitly rejects grammatical construals of intentionality.

The solution that seems to be closest to Crane's view is to endorse a phenomenological conception of directedness or aboutness. Accordingly, intentional states have an essential phenomenology of directedness or aboutness, and this grounds the fact that they can only be described in relational terms. However, this seems to clash with another aspect of Crane's overall outlook. On his view, consciousness is grounded in the entire intentional nature of mental states. So, phenomenology should be grounded in intentionality. But the phenomenological solution seems to ground intentionality in phenomenology. I, therefore, do not find a solution in the volume to the tension between the non-relationality of intentionality and the relationality of intentional talk. This is the first issue that I find puzzling.

Crane's commitment to the non-relationalist account of intentionality goes hand in hand with his rejection of the thesis that intentional states, including beliefs and perceptual experiences, are fundamentally relations to propositions. But Crane combines this rejection with a second thesis: that it is "literally true" that beliefs and experiences are relations to propositions. There is, again, an apparent tension here. Crane addresses it by holding that relations to propositions only model intentional states and talk about relations to proposition, although literally true, is just theoretician's talk. But it is puzzling to me how the labels of "modeling" and "theoretician's talk" remove the tension between non-relationalism and the idea that it is literally true that intentional states are relations to propositions. A central method for doing metaphysics has been to read our ontology from the models that we regard as true. Most Platonists about properties, for example, are realists about properties because they hold that the correct way to model the similarities between objects is to hold that they stand in instantiation relations to the same property in the Platonic realm. Realists about numbers, for example, often hold that the best way to account for the truth of true statements in number theory is to read their explicit quantificational commitments at face value. Thus, if it is true that there is exactly one even prime number, then it is true that numbers exist. It is for the same reason that some moral anti-realists are error theorists.

This is not to say that there are no ways to reconcile the denial of the claim that a model captures the fundamental nature of truth makers for a domain of discourse with the idea that the model is literally true. One might hold that the apparent existential commitments of a model can be removed with correct analysis. Accordingly, we can account for the literal truth of statements such as "An average American owns .75 dogs" without committing ourselves to the existence of average Americans and the property of owning .75 dogs. We can do so because what we mean by this statement is that the total number of dogs owned by Americans divided by the total number of Americans is .75. But Crane does not seem to adopt a strategy like this. His non-relationalist account of intentionality is not an account of what people who think that intentional states are relations to propositions mean. A second way to remove the tension is to provide a non-standard semantics for the model that does not analyze its truth in terms of reference and satisfaction. Attempts to provide inferential role or conceptual role semantics fall within this category. But although Crane opposes semantic accounts of intentionality, his preferred substitute is a phenomenological account, not an inferential role semantics. I therefore find it strange that Crane does not simply deny the truth of the claim that intentional states are relations to propositions.

The third puzzling aspect of Crane's overall picture concerns his appeal to content pluralism to motivate the thesis that intentional states, specifically experiences, are not relations to propositions. Content pluralism, which Crane credits Chalmers for, is the view that (a) there are many different senses of the term 'content' responding to different theoretical demands, and (b) intentional states can typically have multiple contents corresponding to these different senses of content. For example, experiences can have a layer of Fregean content that accounts for their phenomenology (or some aspect of their phenomenology) and a layer of Russellian content that accounts for our intuitions about their truth value or accuracy. It is not clear to me why the idea that relations to propositions only model experiences explains content pluralism. As Crane argues, if experiences are relations to propositions and there are multiple, and sometimes incompatible, propositions that experiences are relations to, then it seems at best peculiar that experiences have a uniform and coherent phenomenal character. But a pluralist about content who wishes to be an intentionalist does not have to endorse the additional thesis that all different senses of content are relevant to the nature of experience. In fact, pluralism about content seems to provide some help for those who wish to identify experiences with relations to propositions. An analogy with a well-known case in meta-ethics might help us see why.

When Mackie argued from moral pluralism to moral anti-realism, his reasoning was that different cultures have conflicting moral codes. Given this conflict, we seem to face the problem of having to choose which set of moral codes is right and which is wrong. Mackie was unhappy with this forced choice. So he argued that rather than declaring one moral code correct and another incorrect, we should embrace moral anti-realism and declare all moral codes false. Mackie thus used the premise that there is widespread disagreement to motivate moral anti-realism. And for this reason, one of the reactions that his argument invited was to deny that there is such a widespread disagreement. Davidson, for example, famously argued that widespread disagreement is impossible because if different cultures widely disagree on the application of moral evaluative terms, then they are not strictly speaking disagreeing because they are not using these terms in the same sense. Mackie and Davidson are both pluralists, albeit in different ways. Where Mackie is a pluralist about moral codes, Davidson is a pluralist about the meaning of evaluative terms that figure in moral codes. More importantly, Davidson's pluralism is compatible with realism and in fact comes to save it from Mackie's attack. As I understand it, Chalmers' content pluralism is close in spirit to Davidson's pluralism about the meaning of evaluative terms. It dissolves the apparent disagreement about whether the content of experience is Fregean or Russellian. As the dissolution of the disagreement would take away the motivation for Mackie's antirealism, the pluralist dissolution of the disagreement seems to take away the motivation for rejecting the view that experiences can be identified with relations to propositions. Crane thinks otherwise, and it is not clear to me why.