On Benefits

Placeholder book cover

Seneca, On Benefits, Miriam Griffin and Brad Inwood (trs.), University of Chicago Press, 2011, 222pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780226748405.

Reviewed by Oleg V. Bychkov, St. Bonaventure University


This volume belongs to the series The Complete Works of Lucius Annaeus Seneca and contains an introductory essay to the series, a translators' introduction, and a translation of Seneca's entire treatise De beneficiis (On the Award and Reception of Favors).

The importance of Seneca is difficult to overestimate. The introductory essay to the series on Stoicism and Seneca's Stoicism -- which is basic, simple, and appropriate for the general reader, even though the reader does not realize until later on that this introduction is not intended specifically for this volume -- points out the importance of his thought for the Roman world (x, xiv-xv), as well as for our own knowledge of ancient Stoicism: almost nothing from the Greek Stoic texts has survived and Roman Stoicism, including that of Seneca, is our major source of information about this ancient school of thought.

The essay continues by stressing the importance of Roman Stoicism, and Seneca in particular, for early Christian thought and even for some modern thinkers up to Kant, the founders of the United States and nineteenth-century American thinkers. As is common among classicists, the introduction skips over the Middle Ages. However, it is well known that, together with Cicero's Stoic account in the De officiis, Seneca's De beneficiis was one of the most widely read and copied classical texts from the eleventh century onward, with nearly 300 extant MSS (cf. L.D. Reynolds, Texts and Transmission). The essay is followed by a very short list of suggested further readings.

The translators Miriam Griffin and Brad Inwood (GI) add another, more technical introduction specifically on the De beneficiis. The translators' English equivalent of Seneca's key Latin term beneficia is 'benefits,' but they provide no explanation as to why they chose to use this cognate which no longer has the same meaning in English. At present, beneficia is more adequately rendered by the English term 'favors,' the benefits of which are explained, e.g., in the introduction to the Cooper/Procopé's (CP) translation of the same work (184), which adopts the term 'favors.'

Griffin and Inwood point out the importance of the subject of awarding and receiving favors both to Roman society as well as to us (1-2). Indeed, another defense of acting in a disinterested and selfless way seems by no means superfluous in the modern world.

The translators' introduction deals with another important issue: the need for an English translation of all seven books of the work (3). Indeed, as the introduction to the series might lead one to believe, the book is intended for the general reader, not for specialists who are expected to be able to read Seneca in the original. There is a good recent translation of Books 1-4 (CP), and it is not clear why the general reader needs all seven books. Thus CP (188), defending their choice of Books 1-4, state that everything essential to the subject is contained in these books and "what remain for the other three books are ancillary questions, attractive but unnecessary"; these last three books, to quote Seneca's own words, "do not really repay the effort" (On Favors 5.1.2). Griffin and Inwood defend the inclusion of the last three books (3) by quoting the rest of this passage: the last three books are "not a waste of time either." The importance of Books 5-7 consists in the fact that "here, Seneca has moved from elementary instruction by precept to a more sophisticated discussion of hard cases, which helps to refine the earlier teaching" (11). The rest of the translators' introduction contains a rather detailed summary of all the books (4-14), which helps one understand Seneca's argument.

The volume ends with an index of proper names and two sets of notes: a longer one of explanatory notes on the translation that explain names, concepts and allusions in the text, and a very short one on textual and editorial issues in the Latin, such as textual variants and corruptions.

Before turning to the text itself, one must address the conceptual issue of rendering the aesthetic aspect of Stoic moral thought in English translations. The key Stoic notion to kalon or honestum clearly has aesthetic overtones in both Greek and Latin and means something like 'fine,' 'excellent' and sometimes even 'beautiful' (cf. Bychkov, Aesthetic Revelation). As CP stress in their introductory essay (191), at the "heart of Stoic ethics" is the idea that "kindness and gratitude, like other things that are honorable and morally good, have a beauty which leads us to choose them for their own sake." The disinterested nature of giving (in this case) and of morals (in general) is analogous to disinterested aesthetic experience (the echoes of this idea can be heard even in modern thought, e.g., in Kant) and, just like aesthetic objects, is attractive "on its own account" apart from any utility. Obscuring this aesthetic aspect of Stoic moral terms makes some of their arguments barely comprehensible to the modern reader.

Griffin and Inwood, who translate honestum as 'honorable,' certainly reflect the aesthetic element in their translation better than, e.g., the Long/Sedley (LS) volume on Stoic thought, which renders to kalon/honestum as 'moral rectitude.' Yet 'honorable' is less overtly aesthetic than 'noble,' 'fine' or 'morally beautiful.' For example, where CP translates honesti species (4.15.1) as "moral beauty," GI prefers the neutral "appearance of what is honorable." At the same time, GI faithfully renders all instances of the root pulchr- in moral discussions as 'beautiful' (cf. 4.16.3 and 4.22.3).

Following Plato and some Stoics, Seneca is fascinated by other aesthetic elements of our experience as well, e.g., by the beauty of the universe, which provides an ample proof of the presence of the gods. In fact, Seneca even tries to portray his foe Epicurus as experiencing the same disinterested wonder in the face of god, as well as fascination with the beauty of the universe. Unfortunately, the aesthetic element in Seneca's Stoicism remains unacknowledged in the introductory essays.

Turning to the translation itself, both CP and GI (8ff) recognize the centrality of Book 4 for Seneca's argument and his presentation of Stoic philosophy, so the following analysis will focus on Book 4.

The few lines in the introduction to the series on the scope of these new translations read (xxvi): "they are designed to be faithful to the Latin while reading idiomatically in English. The focus is on high standards of accuracy, clarity, and style . . . the translations are intended to provide a basis for interpretive work rather than to convey personal interpretations." That is, this translation is expected to serve as a substitute for the Latin for those who cannot read it.

The GI translation certainly achieves all that. It is elegant, flowing, and for the most part highly readable. It is certainly comparable to CP, rarely more awkward and frequently superior to it in clarity, accuracy, and less ambiguous interpretations of the Latin. GI features a freer and up to date use of equivalent English terms; at the same time, it keeps intact the length of Seneca's original sentences without breaking them up, thus preserving his flow of speech for the modern reader. It is about as literal in rendering the Latin as CP.

However, even here occasionally one does encounter some weak or questionable cases of rendering Latin phrases. In 4.6.1, Seneca creates a vivid image of "rivers dragging gold over their river beds" (flumina . . . super quae decurrunt sola, aurum vehentia). While CP gives a very precise rendering, even though somewhat weakening the image ("bearing gold over the beds they flow down along"), GI simply keeps the general sense: "to flow over it [i.e., the earth] bearing gold."

In 4.6.2, Seneca attempts to say that the gods use vast quantities of materials that we admire (as a matter of fact) even in small quantities: vides . . . totas [sc. glaebas] variae distinctaeque materiae, cuius tu parvula frusta miraris. CP renders this passage accordingly, as the indicative suggests: "whole blocks of varied and differentiated material, the tiniest crumbs of which set you marveling." GI, however, introduces a consecutive sense, which is textually not there, thus changing the meaning: "all of material so varied and intricate that you marvel at the smallest fragment."

There are cases where neither CP nor GI captures the subtler meaning adequately. In 4.10.4, Seneca writes non minus . . . spectabo [sc. talem] a quo recepturus sim. What he wants to say is that "the last thing I will care about is [choosing the sort of person] who will return the favor." CP captures the meaning without rendering the passage literally: "the last consideration that I shall have in mind is . . . my chances of getting the favor back." In the GI version, however, even the idea of the 'person who is likely to return the favor' is lost: "nothing shall be further from my thoughts than . . . who is the person from whom I shall receive a return."

In 4.21.3 (Volo referre gratiam: post hoc aliquid superest mihi, non ut gratus sed ut solutus sim), Seneca wishes to say that the return of a favor is in the mental attitude, or in the wish itself to return it; everything else pertains to discharging the debt. So one would expect a translation along the following lines: "I wish to return a favor: whatever remains for me to do after that . . . " or "if there is anything after that . . . ". However, GI has "afterwards I still have something to do . . . " which does not quite capture Seneca's idea.

Another issue is the way Griffin and Inwood handle the textual tradition itself, which is an important part of textual hermeneutics. Unfortunately there are only five lines in the translators' introduction on the textual issues in the De beneficiis and the way they are handled, despite an acknowledgement that there are some textual difficulties with the text. The textual hermeneutics of the translators will have to be reconstructed from their text itself.

GI generally follows Hosius's edition, but in order to smoothen the flow of the argument in difficult cases, GI, just like CP, often follows conjectures rather than the lectiones difficiliores of the MSS, with or without indicating the choice in notes. E.g., in the case of 4.8.1 CP follows Préchac and GI follows Loeb, by adding respectively "for life" or "for the perpetuation of life." In 4.12.2, both CP and GI (without a note) use Koch's conjecture cum instead of the ut of the MSS in order to smooth the logical flow of the text and make it conform to the rest of the argument. While the MSS text defendo, ut tuto transire permittatur could be easily translated as "I defend in order that a safe passage might be afforded to him," GI, paralleling the rest of the argument, chooses to translate (using the conjecture cum) "I defend although I would be allowed to go on in safety" (cf. CP: "though I could go on in safety").

There are cases, however, where GI favors the text of the MSS over a good conjecture that follows the logic of the text better. Thus in 4.9.3 the Latin MSS tradition reads: quaerimus, quid faciamus et quando et quemadmodum. Gertz, who uses only the oldest MS, makes a conjecture quaerimus, cui (or cui id). Hosius chooses cui with Gertz. GI, however, just like CP and Préchac, chooses the MSS reading quid: "enquire what we should do" and defends this reading in a note. However, the defense seems rather weak: indeed, both before this line (eligendos quibus beneficia demus) and after it (eligo cui dem beneficium) Seneca discusses precisely "to whom" to give favors, so the conjecture cui seems to be most sensible.

In other cases GI chooses a conjecture over a lectio difficilior of the MSS that could still be successfully interpreted or over seemingly better conjectures. Thus in a "desperate" (Préchac) textual passage in 4.12.3 Seneca seems to be saying that the situation with awarding favors is similar to buying a nice vacation home. Although awarding favors often turns out to be beneficial, initially one does a favor just for the sake of it, and only then could one consider its benefits. In the same way, one buys a vacation home for non-business reasons, and only later could consider its rental capabilities.

The MSS text (cum erit, tuendum est), though not straightforward, could still be translated as it stands, reading it as cum [sc. ei] erit: "when it will be [in his possession,] then he should consider [i.e., how much income it will bring]." Erasmus's conjecture cum emerit, which both CP and GI follow, could be rendered along the same lines: "when he has bought it, then he should consider [its utility]."

If one were to suggest a conjecture, understanding tuendum est in the sense "one must consider [what is stated immediately above]," the majority of editors who did offer conjectures suggested the meaning "one must consider for what purpose one buys it" or "what purpose it will serve" which is most logical. Thus one could envisage such conjectures as cui emerit, cur emerit, or cui [sc. rei] sit.

However, both CP and GI go in another direction, both in choosing Erasmus's conjecture and in the way they interpret the text that follows. The resulting "when he has bought it, he must look after it" does not logically follow from the context and destroys the smoothness of the argument.

Finally, in one case (4.36.2) GI simply seems to be unaware of a textual issue. Here, the text in all but one MSS reads ne inde beneficium des. Préchac suggests a conjecture ne in te (the reading adopted by CP). GI adopts the text of Hosius who prints ne indigno, a reading he attributes in his apparatus to a late MS (Vratislavensis). However, Préchac prints the same variant as ne indigne (which makes more sense given the majority reading ne inde). Obviously either Hosius or Préchac misreads the MS, a fact that seems to have escaped GI.

Ultimately, the beauty of Seneca's text is his alone, and one must enjoy his style, rhetorical twists and intricacy of thought in the original. But for those who cannot, the GI translation is the next best thing!