On Civic Friendship: Including Women in the State

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Sibyl A. Schwarzenbach, On Civic Friendship: Including Women in the State, Columbia UP, 2009, 341pp., $29.50 (pbk), ISBN 9780231147231.

Reviewed by Naomi Zack, University of Oregon



In On Civic Friendship: Including Women in the State, Sibyl Schwarzenbach develops democratic feminist political theory on the foundation of Aristotle’s idea of philia or civic friendship. Schwarzenbach presents ethical reproductive praxis as an alternative to masculine fraternity and Marxist solidarity. She maintains that civic friendship, unlike feminist care, is egalitarian and reciprocal. Schwarzenbach’s proposal is intended to be compatible with contemporary individualism in competitive culture, against a background of universal human rights. On Civic Friendship is a well-constructed and deeply thought out combination of critique and positive theory, which could radically change contemporary political theory.

In chapter 1, Schwarzenbach offers a general critique of modern liberalism’s failure to give an account of what holds the state or community together. Central national government is believed to be based on individual fulfillment of ideals of the good life in market economies, while the unpaid reproductive work of women, which provides much of the material and social resources for cohesion, is not noted or valued. Schwarzenbach aims to supplant John Locke’s powerful political metaphor of ownership as resulting from a man, who already owns his body and labor, productively “mixing” his labor with something else. Instead, she holds that women’s traditional activities of mixing their labor, often by caring for people and things, but without the result of ownership, should be brought to the forefront of Rawlsian reflective equilibrium. She claims:

For the construction of a plausible modern conception of a civic friendship between citizens, the vast repertoire of particular moral convictions hitherto relegated to the “private,” the “personal,” and the pre-political “merely social” realm can no longer be excluded from the original data pool from which a political reflective equilibrium begins. On the contrary, it is precisely from this sphere of close personal and social relations — the traditional home of women — that one of the most powerful resources for a renewed conception of civic friendship is to be found. (p.18)

In the second chapter, in Part I, “The Past”, Schwarzenbach develops an historical foundation for contemporary philia with an Aristotelian analysis of ethical reproduction, a critique of the model of liberal production, and an analysis of what Marx omitted. She supports an “inclusive” interpretation of Aristotle’s three-part division of the human soul, whereby nutritive and reproductive activities are informed by the rational, intellectual element. Schwarzenbach argues that the normative and ethical aspects of the reproductive soul (e. g. sexual reproduction, care of young, education) extend to the reproduction of relationships that support, or are, human flourishing. Such reproductive actions are praxis, as opposed to production, because they are in large part done for their own sake, rather than for external goods. Just as personal friendship requires a reciprocal reproduction of the other in moral terms, so does Aristotelian political friendship insofar as it is constitutive of a just state(society). Political friendship for Aristotle provides for general concern for each other among citizens, as expressed in institutions and laws.

Schwarzenbach, in the third chapter, contrasts Aristotelian philia with models created by modern political theorists, who have paid no attention to the importance of reciprocal, flexible, political friendship in the state. The reigning liberal production model leaves no room for normative reproductive praxis, relegating it to mere biology, mindless dependence, and servility. This is partly the result of the loss of ideas of stewardship in the historical transmission of the Lockean notion of property. The production model is applied with a general consequentialist moral prospective that minimizes both practical reasoning about particulars and the intrinsic value of praxis as an activity of benevolent concern among citizens.

In chapter 4 Schwarzenbach innovatively interprets Marx’s Economic and Philosophical Manuscripts of 1844 as an application of De Anima, in which Marx attempted to revive both Aristotelian praxis and philia by conceiving of unalienated production as the development of distinctively human capacities. But Schwarzenbach holds that Marx and most of his followers lacked a sense of social labor. Marx and his successors also neglected to consider the cognitive and intentional structures of human emotions, which allow for reproductive projects of education toward greater philia. Missing, too, in political theorists before feminism is an account of care as a reproductive praxis, rather than an emotion or disposition. Overall, Marxism has failed to provide a viable alternative to acquisitive incentive because of its continued attachment to the production model.

Although throughout Part I Schwarzenbach weaves proposals such as emotional reeducation in political life into her critique of the individualistic production model, her own fully positive model is reserved for Part II, “The Present”. In her fifth chapter, Schwarzenbach begins the positive project as an answer to “what it might mean for friendship to ‘go pubic’ as it were” (p. 136), so that it is embedded in contemporary society’s institutions and social structure: fundamental rights and duties would need to be reconceived with the care of people and the environment recognized as more important than production; the state should be understood broadly to include custom, moral consciousness, and history, rather than narrowly restricted to a political constitution and laws; insofar as women are now assuming more public roles, it should be easier to make activities of care a legitimate part of political life. Toward such a transition, John Rawls’s difference principle, stipulating that we “bring the other along” (p. 143), is highly relevant in terms not just of production, but in a strong reading, in terms of the other’s development of capabilities and quality of life. Still, Rawls fails to apply the human capabilities dimension of the principle directly to economic activity and work, ignoring reproductive praxis as inter-activities undertaken for the sake of the other’s well-being, as well as for the intrinsic value of the praxis. (Reproductive praxis has traditionally been associated with ascriptive rather than possessive ownership, and with the gift as opposed to the exchange, both of which create and sustain friendly relationships.)

In chapter 6, Schwarzenbach explains why Rawls’ method of wide reflective equilibrium is useful for feminist reinterpretation of the U.S. constitution. The constitution excludes women by excluding reproductive praxis from recognized labor, either in terms of citizens’ work or the duties of the state. Schwartzenbach also believes that the American political party system, based on a “winner take all” model, is less conducive to the representation of women and their interests than proportional representation would be. A system of proportional representation also precludes the persistence of permanent minorities who are always disadvantaged relative to winning majorites.

In addressing the historically masculine state from a feminist perspective, Schwarzenbach seeks to move (chapter 7) beyond both acceptance of production as the ultimate human activity and models of care that remain parochial in their emphasis on particular cultural identities and mothering. As an alternative, she calls for the category of friendship in political revision and suggests a form of universal civic service that would include care and reproductive praxis. Such a universal civil service would be mandatory between ages 17-25 for about a year: “First and foremost, the basic training would be in the identification, creation, and maintenance of what we have been calling the ‘conditions of a civic friendship’” (p. 232). Civil service of this nature would augment both private and community efforts and in time would replace part of military service.

In her final chaper, Schwartzenbach extends the idea of politike philia as a “guiding norm” for relations among nations (p. 248). The current model of “pluralistic security communities”, under rules of nonviolence and mutual aid, is described in terms of cultural exchange and changes of perception, on the premise that sovereignty no longer has the right to declare war in the name of state interest. Needed most for international philia is recognition in wealthy nations of the value of ethical reproduction that is still a dominant practice in many poor societies. Subsistence local autonomy remains preferable to new dependencies on the global market, as well as being environmentally sustainable.

As initially noted, Sibyl Schwarzenbach’s On Civic Friendship could radically change contemporary political theory. However, much rests on Schwarzenbach’s assumed valorization of the heretofore private sphere, particularly in regard to the work of care traditionally performed by women. The question is how much of this work and its form — even when generalized into friendship — is conditioned by the oppression of women and regulation of their lives under patriarchy. The kind of care or philia proposed by Schwarzenbach as a primary political and economic value, as well as a social organizing principle, might just not be forthcoming in a gender egalitarian society. It might be that if women no longer provide such care after liberation from their traditional roles that neither women nor anyone else will want to do it. This possibility raises empirical questions about human nature and human educability toward optimum ideals, if not toward a new utopia which, after reading this book, some might view as the real Marxist utopia. But it’s not as though history affords us the luxury or even the possibility of deliberately chosen broad political transformations undertaken in an empirical spirit. Rather, the theorist is pretty much obligated at the outset to get her vision right. This requires extensive analysis and critique of every promising big idea. To that purpose, if philia is generalized away from feminist notions of care, some may question whether Schwarzenbach has conclusively distinguished philia from masculinist ideals of universal human benevolence or even Kantian notions of intrinsic dignity.