On Criticism

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Noël Carroll, On Criticism, Routledge, 2009, 210pp., $19.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780415396219.

Reviewed by Alan H. Goldman, College of William & Mary


Noël Carroll's latest book contains what we have come to expect from him: above all, clarity of exposition and argument directed at the fundamental issues in the topic under discussion. His topic here is art (construed broadly) criticism, and he lays out for us in greater detail than before his positions on the interpretation and evaluation of works in different genres. Carroll is one of the major figures in aesthetics, and anyone interested in the field will have to know and address his views.

The main thesis of his book is that criticism aims ultimately and essentially at the evaluation of works, aims to uncover their artistic value, and that it supports its evaluations with reasons. In indicating the sources of value in artworks, critics help audiences to appreciate the works. Criticism is distinguished from other related fields, such as art history, by its evaluative aim. Reasons supporting evaluations are provided by classification, description, analysis, and interpretation of the works, all of which activities are analyzed by Carroll. He maintains that evaluations backed by reasons can be objective, in that categorization or classification of works into types is objective, and these types of works pursue certain artistic purposes in terms of which the works can be evaluated. Critics evaluate artworks, as we evaluate other things, in terms of how well they fulfill their intended purposes. Artworks are therefore to be judged on their own terms, and the central question is always whether the artists succeeded in fulfilling the artistic aims they intended.

Of course, other philosophers will want to attack any or all of these claims. I agree that critics aim primarily to uncover the values (or disvalues) of works, but I see a tension between this central thesis and Carroll's defense of intentionalism in interpretation and evaluation. If a critic aims to facilitate an audience's appreciation of a work's value, doesn't that suggest that the critic ought to aim at allowing the audience to get the most value out of their experience of the work? Limiting interpretation to the uncovering of value specifically intended by the artist does not always allow for such optimal experience.

Carroll offers three arguments in defense of his intentionalistic theory of interpretation, the thesis that interpretation aims to reveal the actual intentions of the artist and that the value of the work lies exclusively in the artist's success in achieving her intention. First, he argues that audiences must appreciate the work as it is, not seek pleasurable experiences from free floating associations prompted by the work or from false views of what the work contains. If the object of criticism is not whatever the audience does with the work, it must be what the artist did, whether he succeeded in doing what he intended to do.

Second, he argues that critics find value in properties of works not experienced by the audience, properties such as originality and historical impact. According to Carroll, a perfect forgery affords the same experience as a genuine work, but it does not have the same value since it is not original and lacks the same historical significance. If the value of artworks lies solely in the experiences they afford, we have to judge the forgery as having the same value as the original. If the value of artworks does not lie in the experiences they afford, it must lie in what the artists have accomplished.

Third, he argues that artists communicate with their audiences via their artworks. If the artwork represents an act of communication, it ought to be interpreted as are other acts of communication. In general, when we interpret what other people communicate to us, we are inferring from their words or acts what they are intending to say or communicate. If interpretation in general aims to uncover communicative intentions, it should be no different with interpreting artworks. We wrong communicators, and so artists, when we attribute to them meanings they never intended.

Anti-intentionalists have answers to these arguments. In regard to the first, everyone agrees that audiences must appreciate artworks as they are, not as the audiences might fantasize them to be. Carroll thinks that this requires restricting interpretation to what the artist actually intended. But anti-intentionalists argue that works themselves -- the paint on the canvas, text as it is written, or notes in a score -- provide the needed constraints. We can add that we must respect the works in the historical contexts in which they were produced without restricting ourselves to what was explicitly intended by their creators.

In response to the argument that artworks are acts of communication and ought to be interpreted as are other such acts, it can be argued that artworks are something more than that. They are produced as public objects for aesthetic appreciation, and this distinguishes them from ordinary ways of communicating. It can be replied further that artists intend their works to be appreciated, most likely intend them to be maximally appreciated. If so, they might not intend to rule out attributions of meanings they do not specifically intend. That may be why they are generally so reticent about their more specific intentions. Thus, even if we restrict interpretation to attributing intentions, we can recognize that intentions exist at different levels of specificity and that we may lack reasons to privilege the more specific over the more general, as Carroll seems to presuppose we should.

Finally, in regard to the argument that critics focus their evaluations on properties not experienced by audiences, this claim seems to assume an impoverished view of the experience of artworks as bare sensory experience of the patches of paint or heard notes. But just as emotional engagement with expressive qualities is integral to the experience of artworks, so is cognitive engagement with a work's relations to other works and to its tradition. Contra Carroll, we do not experience a forgery in the same way as its prototype once we learn that it is a forgery. Education and experience of works change the ways we perceive them. When we learn of the way that the opening movement of Beethoven's Third Symphony transforms composition in the classical style, we experience it differently. Originality and historical impact, while not experienced directly, affect the ways we experience artworks; hence focus on these properties by critics does not refute the thesis that criticism aims to facilitate the most valuable experience of artworks in audiences and so should not be restricted by artists' specific intentions regarding the significance of their works.

Imagine, for example, that Beethoven did not intend to transform compositional style in his third symphony; suppose, presumably contrary to fact, that he simply became fascinated with the melodic transformations and variations and with the modulations in the development section of that opening movement without intending to introduce a new form. Surely we can still admire the work for its unintended historical impact and experience it appreciatively in that light. Indeed, as critics we can not only praise works for properties that were not specifically intended by their creators, we can also criticize works for lacking properties not necessarily integral to their styles. Carroll says that Agatha Christie should not be criticized for the lack of psychological depth in her characters since she aims only at clever plots and elegant writing, and depth is not a feature of the mystery genre at the time she was writing. But especially when we compare the later mystery novels of P.D. James, it might well legitimately occur to us to judge Christie negatively on that score.

If, as noted earlier, artists are generally reticent about their specific intentions, this suggests that they want to leave open the possibility of interpretations of their works they themselves don't envisage. Certainly this is true of composers and performance interpretations. Although composers conduct their own works, other conductors' versions may be preferable. Why, then, should this not be true of critical interpretations as well? If interpretations of works can be incompatible but equally acceptable, then acceptable readings cannot be limited to those intended by artists. Critics always offer interpretations incompatible with previous ones, and it would be naïve of them to think that only their own are correct, exactly matching the intentions of the artists, while all earlier ones are wrong in failing to do so.

Furthermore, critics don't speak as often about what artists successfully intend as they speak about what their works say or do, what kinds of effects they have on viewers or what their aesthetic properties are. Even when artists are not reticent about their own interpretations of their works, this does not prevent critics from proposing alternatives. Henry James notoriously remarked that The Turn of the Screw was simply a ghost story, which did not foreclose other readings of the novella. Hemingway remarked that there were no human heroes in The Sun Also Rises, but many critics have disagreed. Would it matter whether Melville saw Ahab as a heroic if futile defender of humanity against a hostile nature or as an evil megalomaniac blindly leading his crew to certain disaster? Would either intention foreclose the other reading of the novel? Even when critics themselves are professed intentionalists, their criticisms may not match their meta-theory. Richard Wollheim claims to be a Carrollian critic but proceeds to offer interesting Freudian interpretations of paintings that their artists could not have intended in their most Freudian of dreams.

It is also significant here that critics sometimes, although not often, compare artworks across genres. Sometimes, Carroll points out, they can do so in terms of aims shared by styles in different genres. But, he admits at the end of his book, such comparisons may be possible in the absence of shared specific artistic aims. Thus, even in Carroll's account, evaluative criticism is not completely limited to judging artworks on their own terms, in terms of the intended goals of the artists. He claims that such comparisons are then made on the basis of importance to society as a whole. This is unconvincing. Even the greatest symphonies, for example, may have very little importance to society as a whole. It is more plausible that artworks in general have values as art which explain why we classify them all as fine art, and in terms of which cross-genre comparisons can be made. But Carroll is certainly among the majority of contemporary aestheticians in being skeptical of this claim, universally assumed though it was by earlier philosophers of art.

If interpretation is not limited, as Carroll claims it should be, to uncovering what is specifically intended by artists, can it nevertheless be fully objective? Carroll cites the claimed lack of principles linking properties of works to evaluations as the main argument against objectivity. He responds that, while there are no fully general principles that could ground reasons for evaluations across the arts, there are more local principles that derive from the aims of particular genres and styles and of the artists working within them. Objective reasons must be general, must be backed by principles, but these local evaluative generalizations provide sufficient objectivity. Carroll's example of such a principle is that pratfalls are good-making characteristics of slapstick comedies.

But pratfalls make slapstick comedies better only up to a point, and that point varies with context depending on other properties of the plays or movies in question. Too many pratfalls may become tedious or destroy narrative intelligibility, for example. More important, to find aesthetic value in such silliness, one must have a taste for that sort of thing. Disagreements in taste will exist at every level of aesthetic sophistication. Classifications of artworks may well be objective, as Carroll claims, but critics will disagree about the aims of different styles, when those aims are fulfilled (especially if stated in evaluative terms, such as elegance for classical composition), and the value of fulfilling them. Carroll offers the standard response that disagreement abounds in science without posing any threat to claims of objectivity. But scientific disagreements can be explained by the inaccessibility of the evidence and complexity of the theoretical inferences, and no such explanations seem available in aesthetics. (Generalizations can still be made, but they will be generalizations about the aesthetic responses of knowledgeable critics with particular tastes.) The seeming relativity of aesthetic evaluation to subjective taste and the problem it poses to claims of objectivity need more discussion than Carroll provides.

Alternative interpretations notwithstanding, these indications of possible criticisms are not meant to suggest that Carroll's is not the clearest and best defense available for this sort of aesthetic theory (intentionalism is a perfectly acceptable meta-theory for philosophical reviews). Carroll supports his positions by appeal to many examples that reflect his broad knowledge derived from his long experience as a critic as well as philosopher, examples that could not be specifically addressed here.