On Death

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Philodemus, On Death, W. Benjamin Henry (ed., tr.), Society of Biblical Literature, 2009, 160pp., $34.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781589834460.

Reviewed by Tim O'Keefe, Georgia State University


Especially since Thomas Nagel's seminal 1970 article "Death," the Epicurean arguments against the fear of death have been the subject of a sustained and fruitful philosophical conversation. The debates have mostly centered on a handful of Epicurean texts and two arguments. The first, the "no subject of harm" argument, is given by Epicurus and Lucretius. In it, they contend that death is not bad for anybody: neither for the living, as they're not dead, nor for the dead, as they don't exist and hence cannot be harmed. The second, the "symmetry" argument, is given by Lucretius. He draws an analogy between the eternal non-existence preceding your birth and the eternal non-existence after your death and maintains that the two stretches of time equally hold nothing for us to fear, and so we ought to regard our deaths with the same equanimity as we do the time before our births. If these two arguments succeed, they seem to show that death -- at least if it's annihilation, as the Epicureans correctly maintain -- is bad for nobody and should be feared by nobody.

But recently the scope of the discussion has widened. Warren (2004) maintains that the so-called "fear of death" is not a single fear, but a host of fears, including the fears of being dead, of mortality, of dying, and of a premature death. Furthermore, he argues, Epicureans both recognize and respond to this complexity by producing a great variety of arguments against the fears of death.

In this context, the appearance of a new edition of Philodemus' On Death is most welcome. Philodemus was a prominent first-century BCE Epicurean, and the Epicurean library in Herculaneum that was buried by the eruption of Mt. Vesuvius in 79 CE contained many of his works. On Death was unearthed alongside other badly carbonized scrolls in the eighteenth century, and the work of deciphering the papyri (with the help of digital imaging technology) continues today.

What we have available to us are portions of the fourth (and final) book of On Death. Henry has produced the first new edition since 1925 of the complete extant text, and the first one ever published that includes a translation and notes in English. Henry has done a commendable job, and his efforts should help bring Philodemus' treatise the attention it deserves. On Death is an important work, and it helps enrich our understanding of Epicurean thanatology in particular and ethics in general.

The centerpiece of the volume is the text and translation. In the style of the Loeb series, the Greek text is on the left-hand pages, with the English translation on the right. At the bottom of the Greek text is an extensive critical apparatus, and at the bottom of the translation are some explanatory notes, often drawing parallels to other texts or explaining Philodemus' references to Homer or to various philosophers. Henry starts out the volume with a brief (22 pages) but effective introduction, containing information useful for folks from general philosophical readers to papyrologists. In it, Henry sketches out Philodemus' biography, gives the basic Epicurean views on death, summarizes the argument of the treatise, column by column -- quite helpful, given its fragmentary nature -- and discusses the physical characteristics of the text and the history of its scholarly editions. The book closes (pp. 117-160) with photographs of the columns and fragments of papyrus.

On Death demonstrates that the Epicureans were not content to wheel out a few all-purpose arguments as across-the-board cures for the fear of death. Philodemus considers a wide variety of particular worries people have concerning death. These include the fears that you will die with no children, that your enemies will gloat over your death, that you will die away from your homeland, and that you will die at sea. In many cases, Philodemus simply applies the more general Epicurean arguments against the fear of death to the case at hand: for instance, observing that you won't exist after your death to be bothered by the gloating of your enemies. In other cases, Philodemus dismisses the particular fear by noting that there is no rational basis for thinking this type of death is worse than any other. For instance, death at sea may seem particularly fearsome, but you can equally well drown in a bathtub, and having your body devoured by fish is no worse than by maggots and grubs. While some of these arguments are not particularly groundbreaking, it is significant that the Epicureans retail them. Even if a person is convinced that death is not bad for him, he may still inconsistently hold, for instance, that death at sea in particular is bad, and Philodemus rightly shows a concern for tracking down and destroying all of these particular beliefs that fuel the fear of death.

Especially interesting is Philodemus' concession that some forms of the fear of death are natural and blameless, and that even the sensible person may suffer from them. One of the major topics of On Death is the fear of premature death. Philodemus' primary response draws from Epicurean doctrines attested elsewhere. The Epicureans hold that one should wish to have a pleasant life, not merely a long one. Furthermore, the Epicureans idiosyncratically insist that peace of mind and lack of bodily distress are the limits of pleasure, with peace of mind being far more important. The wise person attains peace of mind by recognizing the natural limits of his desires and ridding himself of superstitious fears, and once he has achieved this state, further time does not increase his pleasure. The result is that the wise person does not need any additional time for his life to be complete, and hence he has nothing to lose by dying sooner rather than later.

But Philodemus allows (15.5-10) that living longer can be beneficial, by giving one time to be able to develop the virtues and acquire wisdom, so that one can then live well and pleasantly, and he concedes (17.32-19.11) that a young person who is progressing in philosophy and wisdom would be stung with pain by the prospect of being snatched away before attaining it completely. So Philodemus seems to admit that death can be bad for the person who has died -- at least in the case of somebody who otherwise would have attained wisdom and the other virtues, which the Epicureans hold to be both necessary and sufficient for happiness, since death makes that person's life worse than it would otherwise have been. And since it is rational to fear something if and only if it is bad for you, fearing death in this case is rational.

We should not overstate the strength of these conclusions. Philodemus emphasizes that even the person who is still progressing in wisdom has surely already tasted many goods, which he regards with gratitude, and that his life is far better than those of long-lived fools. So the fear he feels is merely a 'bite' of pain -- a natural and negative emotional reaction to something genuinely bad, but one that is not strong enough to disturb fundamentally his peace of mind. (Chapter 2 of Tsouna (2007) details Philodemus' doctrine of 'bites.')

Despite this, the conclusions do seem inconsistent with the Epicurean "no subject of harm argument," which contends that death is bad for neither the living nor the dead. Let us imagine an aspiring Epicurean, Arnie, who was slowly overcoming his unfortunate religious upbringing but who contracted cancer and died six months later, at age 20, one year before he would have perfected himself. When we look back at Arnie's life as a whole, we can state that his dying of cancer at 20 years of age made it worse than it otherwise would have been, and Philodemus' contention that Arnie will feel a bite of regret at the prospect of dying shortly before attaining full happiness is plausible. Nonetheless, even in this case the orthodox Epicurean "no subject of harm" would still seem to apply. Prior to receiving the Epicurean gospel, Arnie was harmed by his superstitious beliefs concerning meddling gods and his vain and empty desires. As Arnie progressed in wisdom, these harmful psychic states were slowly replaced, but as they had not been completely eradicated, they were still harming him. Arnie's death did not harm him then, as it hadn't occurred. And while his untimely death prevented him from attaining wisdom, he no longer exists after his death to be harmed by this deprivation.

Another fear of death that Philodemus discusses (25.2-36) is that your death will leave your parents, wife, children, or others close to you in dire straits. Philodemus doesn't take the crassly egoistic line that their sufferings after your death won't hurt you and hence shouldn't be feared. Instead, just as with the fear of dying before attaining wisdom, he acknowledges that this fear is legitimate, and he gives advice on how to manage rather than eradicate it. More than anything else, says Philodemus, the prospect that people you care about may suffer because of your death has a natural sting and stirs up tears in the sensible person. But it doesn't cause him great suffering, as he will have carefully made provisions on their behalf, ensuring that they have guardians who will take care of them as much as he himself does. Once again, this 'bite' of pain is compatible with fundamentally enjoying peace of mind.

That the wise person would naturally feel pain at the prospect of something that cannot be bad for him appears inconsistent with Epicurus' egoism and hedonism in psychology and ethics. Epicurus' own views are controversial, especially his views on friendship (see O'Keefe (2001) for arguments that he's consistently egoistic, but others disagree). But Philodemus allows for the existence of other-regarding concern for one's friends and family (see Tsouna (2007), esp. 27-31, for more on this), and On Death shows him trying to accommodate these attitudes within Epicurean thanatology.

I hope the above shows why On Death is significant. Still, it's important not to oversell it. The facing pages of text and translation total 94 pages, but this overstates the amount of text. On Death is quite fragmentary. The English translation rarely takes up more than half a page, and frequently takes up much less. And the state of the text means that quite often the English translation goes like the following: "Nor … neither the moisture … procreative … easy … and [accompanies (?)] hard … also concerning those are [strangled (?)] … fit … On the other hand, dying of self-induced starvation." (6.4-10) And even where the text is in better shape, the arguments are usually fragmentary or cursory, so that much of their philosophical interest comes from what we can reconstruct about the Epicureans' philosophical commitments on the basis of these arguments rather than from the details of the arguments themselves. On Death is no Nicomachean Ethics, or even Cicero's ­On Ends.

Chapter 10 of Voula Tsouna's The Ethics of Philodemus (pp. 239-311) already has an extended explication of the extant portions of On Death, including translations of many of the longer and better-preserved passages. For most readers, Tsouna would be a more accessible and illuminating introduction to the treatise than this edition, and Warren's Facing Death is the best book-length introduction to the full panoply of Epicurean arguments against the fear of death and criticisms of them. Warren looks in particular at Philodemus' treatment of the fear of premature death (pp. 143-153).

Still, the production of this new edition of the complete extant text is a great accomplishment, and it will be an invaluable resource for those who wish to work on Philodemus, making an improved version of On Death easily available.

Works Cited

Nagel, T. 1970/1979. "Death." Noûs 4: 73-80. Reprinted in Mortal Questions, 1-10. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

O'Keefe, T. 2001. "Is Epicurean Friendship Altruistic?" Apeiron 34: 269-305.

Tsouna, V. 2007. The Ethics of Philodemus. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Warren, J. 2004. Facing Death: Epicurus and His Critics. Oxford: Oxford University Press.