On Denoting 1905-2005

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Guido Imaguire and Bernard Linsky (eds.), On Denoting 1905-2005, Philosophia, 2005, 451pp., €98, ISBN 3884050915.

Reviewed by Kevin C. Klement, University of Massachusetts, Amherst


This anthology, with an international set of authors, commemorates the centenary of the publication of Bertrand Russell's famous article "On Denoting" (hereafter OD) in 1905. OD was dubbed a "paradigm of philosophy" by Frank Ramsey, and analytic philosophers still see it as important today for the philosophy of language, metaphysics and philosophical logic. It might seem puzzling that a century-old paper, less than 20 pages, mostly dedicated to the meaning of phrases beginning with "the" and similar articles, should still receive such attention. The reasons for the continued interest are many. The first concerns Russell's conjecture that a sentence of the form:

(1) The F is G.

does not have a simple subject-predicate logical form but instead that of a quantified statement asserting that one and only one thing is F, and that thing is G, or symbolically:

(2) (∃x)((y)(Fyy = x) & Gx).

This was one of the first realizations that the logical structure of a sentence or proposition may differ significantly from its surface grammar. A second source of interest lies in OD's criticisms of rival views, notably Meinong's theory of nonexistent objects, and Frege's theory of sense and reference. OD also contains a lengthy, general argument against theories that make a distinction between meaning and denotation, nicknamed the "Gray's Elegy Argument" (hereafter GEA) after one of Russell's examples. This passage has received significant attention lately, largely because it is uncharacteristically unclear, and the nature and cogency of Russell's argument is widely disputed. Lastly, OD is heralded for drawing philosophers' attention to problems involving identity, non-existence, propositional attitudes and scope ambiguity.

In addition to a reprint of OD, this volume contains 13 contemporary articles dealing with the interpretation, evaluation, and historical and philosophical importance of OD, as well as a combined bibliography. The first three deal largely with interpretation. The first, a lengthy piece by James Levine, identifies the differing role of the initial arguments in OD against Frege and Meinong vis-à-vis the GEA that comes later. Levine argues, plausibly, that the earlier arguments aim to show that sentences that include denoting phrases such as "the author of Waverly" are not about any entity denoted by the phrase, whereas the GEA is aimed more narrowly against propositions having constituents that shift their aboutness to something else. Levine concludes that while the initial arguments do hold force against Frege, the GEA involves assumptions Frege would not accept, and has no similar force. He also discusses these arguments' relationship to Russell's attempts to solve the logical paradoxes. It is here that the article is the weakest, as Levine exaggerates the differences between Russell's 1904 zig-zag theory and the type-theory of Principia Mathematica, and misunderstands some logical notation borrowed from Peano used in a March 1904 letter to Jourdain. However, this does not significantly detract from the overall piece. Next, Alasdair Urquhart offers a close textual look at the GEA, and reaches the conclusion that it is flawed, principally due to Russell's vacillating between using the letter "C" as a schematic letter and as a metalinguistic variable for phrases. This reinforces complaints made earlier by Alonzo Church that the GEA is plagued by use/mention confusions. While Urquhart is no doubt right that Russell vacillates in his usage (and so does not live up to the standards set decades later by Tarski and Quine), he does not explore whether a reconstructed version of the argument might do better, nor how Russell might have succumbed to such straightforward blunders. In sum, Urquhart's article is uncharitable. However, Urquhart does reprint an interesting letter written by Russell in 1959 to Ronald Jager in which he downplayed the GEA in favor of other considerations for the theory of descriptions.

A more sympathetic treatment of GEA is given next by Peter Simons, who holds that Russell's chief complaint is that proponents of the meaning/denotation distinction cannot explain what meanings are, except indirectly as entities standing in the relations of being expressed by phrases and of denoting denotations. Since these relations themselves cannot be explained independently from meanings, such theories are left incomplete. While the text of OD suggests that Russell meant something stronger (something closer to a refutation) than that suggested by Simons, the issue Simons pinpoints is independently interesting. So too is his suggestion that a meaning-realist might better explain them with an abstraction principle of the form:

Phrase A and phrase B have the same meaning if and only if R(A,B)

where R is an equivalence relation giving the identity conditions for meanings. Simons, however, highlights some potential problems with this approach, most especially that there are many distinct relations that might plausibly fit here.

The next two articles are devoted to Russell's confrontation with Meinong. In the first, Janet Farrell Smith sketches the historical interactions between the two men, and summarizes the influences, both positive and negative, of Meinong and Russell. Smith lists "five arguments" given by Russell against Meinong's theory of unreal objects (though perhaps they would be better characterized as five presentations of the same argument). Smith locates the chief source of their disagreement with Russell's logical realism and universalism, especially his commitment to the universal applicability of the law of non-contradiction. While Smith's treatment of Russell's reaction to Meinong is fair, she sometimes misportrays Russell's own views, including the early being/existence distinction from 1903's The Principles of Mathematics. It is often thought that OD represented the end of this distinction. However, works as late as 1912 show that Russell still believed that universals, and other abstract entities existing outside of time, had "being" but did not "exist", and even that we can be acquainted with them. These sorts of non-existents, however, were not what Russell found objectionable in Meinong's ontology.

This is followed by a piece by Maria Reicher, which also outlines Russell's argument against Meinong. Reicher considers responses given by contemporary neo-Meinongians involving the distinction between nuclear and extra-nuclear properties, but suggests that they do not fully answer Russell's worries. Reicher gives her own reconstruction of Meinong's views that she believes can do better. However, as it involves treating the not-fully-real entities (the golden mountain, etc.) basically as universals, it is not clear that it still counts as a Meinongian view, as she seems willing to admit.

The anthology then turns from Meinong to Frege, with a piece by F.J. Pelletier and Bernard Linsky on Frege's oft-neglected views on descriptions. They differentiate four "theories" found in Frege's work: (1) a theory similar to Hilbert's in which a description "the F" is only taken as meaningful or well-formed after it has been proven that there is a unique F, (2) one similar to Strawson's whereupon improper descriptions like "the present King of France" have no reference, and sentences containing them no truth-value, (3) an approach, similar to Carnap's, which regards improper descriptions as designating some special chosen object, and (4) the account adopted in Frege's Grundgesetze, in which "the F" refers to the class of Fs if there is not a unique F. It seems fairer to say that of these, only (2) constitutes a theory: the passages cited in line with (1) and (3) are recommendations Frege made for avoiding logical mistakes stemming from empty or ambiguous expressions, and (4) is a stipulation about what his own language's symbols mean, not a "theory" about how language actually works. Pelletier and Linsky provide a chart comparing how these approaches fare with regard to various problem sentences, with the result for Russell's theory of descriptions given by comparison. It is not clear how helpful this is in clarifying Frege's own views, because they list their results based on applying a formal semantic treatment utilizing modern set theory, which the authors themselves admit clashes with Frege's own mindset. For example, on the Grundgesetze theory, "F(the F)" is listed as false whenever "the F" is not a proper description. This is because, in contemporary well-founded set theories, a set cannot contain itself. Frege himself likely would not have foreseen or accepted this result. Frege's own views would have been made clearer if the peculiarities of modern set theory had been kept out of consideration.

The next few essays address OD from within the larger context of Russell's greater philosophical project and its influence. These include a piece by Francisco Rodríguez-Consuegra, sketching the development of Russell's views about belief and judgment from 1900-1904, when he believed in propositions as mind-independent complex entities, until his explicit acceptance of the "multiple relations theory of judgment" in 1911; a piece by Herbert Hochberg entitled "Descriptions, Paradox and Russellian Types"; and one by Elena Tatievskaya, portraying Wittgenstein's theory of internal properties as historically related to Russell's theory of descriptions. Despite familiarity with the works discussed, I was unable to understand fully, and hence unable to evaluate, either the piece by Rodríguez-Consuegra or the piece by Tatievskaya. I found Rodríguez-Consuegra's trains of thought difficult to follow, and in the case of Tatievskaya, I suspect language differences posed a barrier to making herself fully understood.

Hochberg discusses how the theory of descriptions could be useful to Russell in responding to various paradoxes and objections, including Russell's paradoxes of classes and predication, Bradley's paradox, and Davidson's "Great Fact" argument. Hochberg mainly speculates about ways Russell might have employed his views, rather than attempting a historical study of the connections Russell himself saw. While Hochberg's suggestions are interesting, the paper is marred slightly by some small misunderstandings. Like many others, Hochberg mistakenly identifies Russell's propositional functions with (intensional) properties or universals.[1] Hochberg also suggests avoiding the paradox involving non-self-applicable propositional functions by insisting that the abstract "(λφ)~φ(φ)" is a dyadic form, thereby rejecting "(λφ)~φ(φ)[(λφ)~φ(φ)]" as ill-formed. This is a misunderstanding. Since all occurrences of "φ" in "(λφ)~φ(φ)" are bound by the same λ-operator, this is unambiguously a monadic form in the lamdba calculus. (Of course, Russell himself did not use such notation, and there is reason to believe that the circumflexion device used in his informal discussion in Principia Mathematica was not an official part of the language.[2])

The section concludes with a piece by Thoman Mormann, examining later developments of Russell's views on logical constructions, and in particular the construction of space points in The Analysis of Matter (1927). Mormann claims that Russell's work, and that of Carnap's Aufbau (1928), anticipate the important results in topology of M. H. Stone, though, in Russell's case, it was hindered by dubitable epistemological commitments.

The next two selections are mainly devoted to evaluation of OD. First, Oswaldo Chateaubriand faults Russell for not distinguishing definite descriptions from descriptive predicates, and claims that this distinction helps pose more elegant solutions to some of Russell's puzzles. Chateaubriand also criticizes the GEA, alleging that Russell wrongly assimilated denoting phrases with their senses or meanings. While some use-mention sloppiness hints in this direction, a charitable reader can recognize that Russell never meant to identify what he calls "denoting complexes" with linguistic items. In the next article, J. W. Degen outlines what he takes to be several flaws, some minor, some major, with Russell's views in OD. Degen's complaints are almost universally based on misunderstandings of Russell's views, or are levied without adequate argumentation. Degen insists that it is preferable to take descriptive and functional terms as non-reducible parts of a language than to require that such terms always be expanded via Russell's quantification means, though Degen's reasons for this seem to hinge on convenience only. Degen faults Russell for not explaining his complaint (against Meinong) that unreal entities cannot be terms of a proposition, and for not explaining what he means by an "incomplete symbol". Such worries are immediately cleared up when one appreciates that "On Denoting" is an attempt to understand the make-up of mind-independent propositions, identified neither with sentences nor with anything psychological like a thought. Early Russell identified facts with true propositions: to say that an unreal entity cannot be a term in a proposition is to say that there are no facts of which unreal entities are a part. An incomplete symbol, for Russell, is one that does not directly correspond to any unified constituent in the proposition expressed. Most galling, however, is Degen's complaint about Russell's having written, in OD, that "either 'The present King of France is bald' or 'The present King of France is not bald' must be true," since both may be false if there is no present King of France. The quotation is taken out of context. If Degen had read further in "On Denoting", he would have seen that Russell himself fully explains the situation a few pages later.

In the last selection, Guido Imaguire looks at Russell's theory of descriptions from the standpoint of Brandom-style inferential semantics. Imaguire argues that from within that approach, there is evidence for supposing Russell right that the contribution made by a definite description to the logical/inferential properties of a sentence differs from that of a proper name. Imaguire takes this as a corrective to Brandom's own work. If "n" is a name, "t" any individual term and "F(t)" a sentence, then for all p, if you can infer p from "F(t)" along with "t=n", then there is a sentence q, where q can be inferred from "F(t)" alone, such that p differs from q by at most substitution of "n" for "t", whereas this would not be the case if "n" were a description. However, it is unclear that this helps support the particular sort of theory of descriptions proffered by Russell. Certainly Imaguire gives us no reason to think that the inferential properties of a statement of the form (1) above correspond exactly to one of the form (2). Secondly, the differences may not amount to anything like a distinction in kind. Imaguire admits that due to conventions governing the use of names, certain special inferences are possible from sentences involving proper names. From "Mary is bald" we can infer that there is at least one bald woman. Given this, the lesser inferential power of names as compared with explicit descriptions may simply be due to their peculiar minimal kind of descriptive meaning. Moreover, even these relatively minimal inferences are likely enough to undermine Imaguire's own proposed technical distinction.

The editors of this anthology seem to have taken a somewhat "hands off" approach. Perhaps as a result, the 13 new essays vary widely in quality and originality. It is difficult to make a uniform evaluation of the whole volume. Some pieces are so unclear or poorly argued that it is unlikely they would have been published in a refereed journal. Others constitute significant contributions to the secondary literature on Russell or the philosophy of language. The pieces by Levine, Simons and Pelletier and Linsky are the most important, and definitely worth a read for anyone who still finds Russell's century-old discussion about whether or not the present King of France is bald of enduring philosophical interest.

[1] On the difference between Russell's propositional functions and (intensional) properties, see Kevin C. Klement, "Putting Form Before Function: Logical Grammar in Frege, Russell and Wittgenstein," Philosopher's Imprint 4 (August 2004): 1-47.

[2] See Gregory Landini, Russell's Hidden Substitutional Theory, (New York: Oxford, 1998), chap. 10, and Kevin C. Klement, "Russell's 1903-05 Anticipation of the Lambda Calculus," History and Philosophy of Logic 24 (2003): 15-37.