On Dialogue

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Dmitri Nikulin, On Dialogue, Lexington Books, 2006, 286pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 0739111396.

Reviewed by Pol Vandevelde, Marquette University


Under a rather humble title Dmitri Nikulin offers in this book a substantial account of what dialogue is and involves. He offers a detailed description and discussion of the different mechanisms of dialogue, its categories and constituents, as well as a useful and instructive review of the different uses of dialogue from Plato to more contemporary authors. At the same time he makes a striking ontological claim regarding the role and function of dialogue, arguing that to be means to be in dialogue.

This ontological claim is a generalization of the views of Bakhtin on literature. Bakhtin was among the first to bring to the fore the dialogicity of what appeared to be monological discourse. In his studies of Rabelais and Dostoevsky Bakhtin showed how novels are polyphonic, how a voice is permeated by other voices at the very moment it claims to be its own. He dedicated several works to the logic particular to dialogue and came to see dialogue as a literary genre. Nikulin wants to extend this view of dialogue and polyphony beyond the boundaries of literature and generalize the inner workings of a text to being: being is, for Nikulin, dialogical. Most of the book is devoted to building and defending this ontological claim that dialogue is the conditio humana.

This claim appears to have two sides (which Nikulin mentions but does not explicitly distinguish): an anthropological aspect and an ontological one. On the anthropological side dialogue is defined in its specific features by contradistinction with monologue. Taking over Bakhtin's understanding that dialogue is a "zone of contact" in which one has access to another and to oneself, Nikulin argues that in dialogue one realizes oneself freely and unpredictably, although not accidentally. Through a discussion of the many different forms of dialogue, dialogue as liberating, as truth telling (parrhesia), idle chat, epistolary exchange, etc., Nikulin emphasizes the interaction in dialogue, so that the question of the truth, of true statements or of valid claims, is subservient to the means through which truth or validity arise as possible questions.

An interaction involves an other. Through a historical outline of what an other can be (in Buber, Levinas, and others) and a description of the features an other has, Nikulin distinguishes three types of other: the other of oneself (the personal other), the other person (with whom there is a dialogue), and the corporeal other (the world). Nikulin argues that otherness is thus not to be understood as a counter-subject or object before a subject, but as constitutive of self. The interaction in dialogue precedes the existence of self and other, so that it is from within the interaction that individuation takes place. Rather than an encounter, dialogue is a process of differentiation leading to the birth of a socially, culturally, and traditionally permeated self. Only in and through dialogue does personal autonomy happen; autonomy is understood not as self-constitution, but as self-fulfillment and self-acceptance (229).

The person in dialogue manifests his or her presence through the voice, which is the minimal embodiment of a person. Since there is a person only within dialogue, the voice becomes for Nikulin an ontological category. The voice as expression of some inner mechanisms or thoughts, as the manifestation of some feelings and emotions accompanying our words or thoughts, is only an epiphenomenon. Besides this accidental character the voice is also substantial: it is the style of our being in the world, manifesting how entangled we are in an environment, a culture, and a tradition so that other people recognize us as a voice without fully encompassing us. They cannot predict what we are going to do or say, but whatever we do or say appears retrospectively as not unexpected: it was in keeping with our style. The voice names this indefinable and ineffable quintessence of a person, one which is not internal, as an essence, but rather a mode of being or a style of behaving.

Nikulin takes advantage of the original meaning of the Latin word persona as the mask actors wear on stage. Because the mask is frozen and only offers generalized features, it is the voice of the actors that makes the character present, alive, "sounding" (45). Thus, besides its linguistic and intonational aspects, the voice also has a personal character. As the minimal embodiment or minimal corporeality needed for interacting with other persons, my voice is thus not just my use of language or my modulation of language, but also who I am. This leads to the second, ontological, aspect of Nikulin's claim: being is being in dialogue.

This "I am," which is manifested by my voice, is not just the "who" I have always already been; this "I am" indicated by the voice is also the "with whom" and "for whom" I have been, so to speak: there is a native polyphony in my voice. Although my voice is independent -- I am the one who speaks -- it is not isolated or singled out. "I am" literally means: "I am a dialogue," in which there is no center, no starting voice, and no privileged ear.

Being is a communicative structure that is "polycentric or polyfocal" (49). "To be" means "to dialogically communicate with the other" (xi). There may be being before dialogue or outside dialogue, but the "before dialogue" is itself a category of dialogue within a retrospective qualification. Pure being or pure existence cannot be thought. Similarly, to speak of an isolated being can only be a manner of speaking, from within the dialogue. If used literally, the expression "isolated being" is a contradictio in adiecto.

In order to make his case that being is being in dialogue, Nikulin makes use of several of Bakhtin's notions: "unfinalizability," "nucleus" of a person, what Nikulin calls "eidema," and "allosensus."

My voice as my embodiment gives away my style, but does not exhaust my possibilities: to be in dialogue does not mean to be confined or limited; on the contrary, my voice reveals me as inexhaustibility. To be unfinalizable is not the same as being unfinished. The latter names a state of incompleteness, the former a state of being not finished or finalized in principle. It is possible to be unfinalizable, while still complete and thus not unfinished. This state of being unfinalizable is what the voice manifests. People understand and recognize my voice as the style of being who I am, but not as a set of propositions or beliefs or as a system of relations or thoughts that could represent me. I am a voice among other voices in dialogue and my voice itself is the dialogical echo of other voices in me. Nikulin differentiates this notion of being unfinalizable from Gadamer's notion of openness to the other. Unfinalizability presupposes not only, as does Gadamer's openness, another as interlocutor, but also an other within oneself. It is thus more than a capacity to listen; this other within is what allows for a range of possible instantiations of self without these instantiations being a dissemination of self, since the self is not unified from the start. Unfinalizable also means that the self can never be presented and thematized, although the self can be present and complete.

Playing with the German words gegeben (given) and aufgegeben (to be accomplished), Nikulin argues that the self is not a substance-like core or a content that is given, but a "task to be accomplished." What is given are the masks or the roles a person assumes, and what is to be accomplished (aufgegeben) is to be "always capable of being new by means of more than simply assuming another role as the result of finalizing accidental circumstances" (66).

Nikulin borrows from Bakhtin the notion of "nucleus" of a person or the "personal idea" and calls it eidema. Eidema names the consistency and coherence a person manifests with regard to others and self, which is revealed in and as the voice. Although unpredictable regarding particular actions or behaviors because a person is unfinalizable, there remains in the series of actions and behaviors a "personal character" or a style by which sameness is manifested and recognized. Eidema is not a metaphysical notion: it is not a Platonic idea, a Kantian constitutive or regulative idea; it is not anything physiological or moral; and it is not a function or a relation or a substance. Strictly speaking the eidema cannot be directly presented, although it is what makes a person present as a person. The eidema is both what is grasped by others as my style of being, manifested by and in the voice, and what makes me a person as a voice in a dialogue; in this latter sense the eidema is the other within, the personal other, which expresses my sameness without relying on a previous content of self.

The eidema cannot be said to precede a person either temporally or ontologically as one who is defined by one's eidema, and yet it is also not an abstraction from a number of individual acts of expression and communication. Because of this, it cannot be said that the 'what' or 'essence' of the eidema is separable or conceivable (e.g., as an abstraction) apart from its 'is' or its 'existence' (75).

Working from Bakhtin's notions of "heterosensus" and "heteroglossia" Nikulin uses the notion of "allosensus" in order to criticize and complement the notion of "consensus." Consensus, Nikulin argues, is the death of dialogue to the extent that consensus aims at an understanding that, once shared in a consensual way, is nobody's understanding, but an abstract content. It may have been reached through dialogical communication, but in the process it becomes unilaterally monological and annihilates the dissensus that is the engine of dialogue. By contrast dissensus offers the possibility of an allosensus, which is a process in which all positions, the other's and one's own, however inchoate they may be, are to be included. The goal of allosensus is not to reach a synthetic third term, bridging my and the other's position, but to acknowledge fully and to unwrap the inexhaustibility of the other as well as of oneself.

In order to reach allosensus, a type of argumentation is needed that is different from traditional adversarial argumentation, whose purpose is to knock down opponents' views and to prevail in an antagonistic fashion. The "allosensual" argumentation attempts to remain agonistic while acknowledging differences, thereby doing justice to the opponents' views and one's own in their respective polyphony. This is also the form of argumentation Nikulin himself seems to use in the book. He attempts to give traction to thought, inviting readers to pursue the argument, rather than to build a thesis or construct a theory.

This type of argumentation appears prominently in the most theoretically adventurous chapter of the book -- appropriately titled "Being" -- in which Nikulin offers an alternative to the thinking of being. Being is not, as it is in Buber, relation within the original I-Thou structure. Being is not prior to dialogue, albeit dialogical. Being thus needs multiplicity: "it needs being(s) that are themselves present in a whole multiplicity of others as other beings" (254). Dialogue is where being is present, through persons who communicate. In dialogue, being is individuated in persons in dialogue with other persons.

Taking another view from Bakhtin, that an event is co-being in the sense of being with the other, Nikulin understands that the being in dialogue is an event of being with others, which is thus a shared being. Just as a text is always meaningful within a context, I am within the happening of a dialogue. In order to be, "one must 'event' with others in dialogue" (259).

The short conclusion in the form of a small dialogue reinforces some of the points of the book, like this one:

you are not forced to answer but you do answer, because you are; you only properly exist at this very moment, when you are talking to the other, when you are discussing with the other (263).

This conclusion also adds some qualifiers to the "being in dialogue":

You are: you exist properly in dialogue, as a person and in what it means to be a person, as one who is recognized in dignity, equality, and in reciprocal relation to the other, and as one who is capable of love, independence, freedom, and so on (264).

At the same time this dialogue shows the fragility of "allosensual" argumentation. We can grant Nikulin that it is indeed a limit of adversarial argumentation to tend to multiply distinctions ad nauseam in order to refute a position, while losing sight of the question whether these subtle distinctions correspond to meaningful differences. And it is indeed an advantage of allosensual argumentation to give a hearing to alternate positions and to reinstate in argumentation the value of relevance, significance, and meaningfulness. Still, after reading this book, which opens many new avenues and invites different methodologies for rethinking traditional problems, many readers will want to know more about "what" an "eidema" or a "voice" or a "dialogue" "really" is.

While it is legitimate to use concepts as operative, more like moving pieces in a mechanism than like still pieces in an edifice, it is also incumbent upon an author who proposes alternatives to discuss in detail and criticize in their own terms some of the positions that are claimed deficient. Regarding person, there is so much written on self, communication and their combinations that a thorough discussion of some of these views would be helpful for truly understanding what the alternative really involves. While Nikulin's review of how dialogue has been understood is useful, his discussion of Buber, Levinas, Gadamer, and Habermas, among others, remains somewhat superficial. The sheer limit of a book would prevent both a thorough discussion of these figures and the presentation of the author's views; but without a thorough discussion and "adversarial" argumentation against some positions (just for the sake of an example, I would mention: Parfit on person, Habermas on communicative action or Ricoeur on narrative self) the book's main argument tends to reduce to what the concluding dialogue states as a brief invitation to discuss further:

A: …We are right now, as we speak in this very dialogue, trying to explain this personal other to ourselves by explaining it to each other.

D: And so we will keep discussing it, as we always do.

Regarding "dialogical being", it is not clear what happens in a dialogue that qualifies as "being," instead of simply acculturation, socialization or intersubjectivity. Further discussion and more arguments would be welcome. Similarly, without a thorough analysis of the different modes of being (like natural entities, living entities, persons), it is difficult to grasp what Nikulin "really" means by "being."