On Emotions: Philosophical Essays

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John Deigh (ed.), On Emotions: Philosophical Essays, Oxford University Press, 2013, 235pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199740192.

Reviewed by Jesse Prinz and Dan Shargel, Graduate Center, CUNY


These twelve essays (ten newly published) are by some of the most distinguished emotion researchers in philosophy. The volume is a memorial to the late Robert Solomon, who brought emotions back into the philosophical spotlight after decades of neglect. Few papers directly engage Solomon's work, however, so it is not intended as a tribute to his contributions. Indeed, the collection's greatest weakness is its lack of unity. Few papers cover the same themes, and most discuss relatively narrow topics, so the volume does not serve as a state-of-the art survey of core theories. There is also little effort to bring emotion research up to date by including younger authors or profiling some of the more interdisciplinary work that has come to hold a central place in emotion theory and philosophy of mind more broadly. This leads us to wonder, whom is this volume for? Those new to the area will find little foundational guidance here, and veteran emotion researchers will find no indication of where the field is going now. These flaws, though serious, are compensated for by the high quality of the essays. Here we offer a brief overview.

We include in our tally of twelve essays the substantial introduction, by editor John Deigh. For newcomers this is perhaps the most useful contribution since it offers an overview of Solomon's views that entails surveying the changing fortunes of emotion theory throughout the 20th century. Deigh is a long-time contributor, and he serves as an able tour guide here, though with a telling oversight. While listing authors and books that have appeared since Solomon's seminal The Passions (1976), Deigh leaves readers stranded in the 1980s. He mentions that Solomon continued to grapple with later trends, such as the rise of neo-Darwinian and neo-Jamesian theories, but mentions no key works or authors by name. This seems myopic given Solomon's own effort to promote younger researchers. There is a missed opportunity to do a historical survey that looks forward as well as backward, a directional bias manifest throughout the volume.

In the next essay, Robert Roberts develops a theory of the psychological underpinnings of justice. He identifies justice itself as a 'passion,' his term for a character trait that explains complex emotional dispositions. He defends this approach by noting that we might undergo any type of emotion as a result of our commitment to justice, depending on the circumstances that we find ourselves in. Indeed, we diagnose each other's passions in part by observing the manner in which those circumstances evoke different types of emotional responses. Although this approach has a great deal of merit, Roberts may err in tying justice too closely to emotions. It is, as he argues, theoretically useful to posit a passion for justice as a way of explaining patterns of emotion elicitation. However, this same passion is also manifest when it motivates behavior that goes against the current of prevailing emotions. An agent who is truly committed to justice will resist self-interested biases, which often are strengthened by emotions. Ultimately we should develop a theory of passions, including the passion for justice, that includes but also extends beyond the role that passions play in eliciting emotions.

Martha Nussbaum offers a novel reading of Mozart's Marriage of Figaro. Conventionally described as politically chary, Nussbaum describes it as a radical work, which highlights the importance of love as a civic emotion, and contrasts it with shame, vengefulness, and other emotions associated with honor. Nussbaum gives a gendered reading to the contrast she finds in Figaro, with honor on the male side and love, empathy, and play on the female side. As a matter of Mozart interpretation, this seems like an insight. We also welcome Nussbaum's focus on the neglected topic of civic emotions, and the good case she makes for love. We worry, however, that, as a normative thesis, gender-tagging emotions runs the risk of essentializing gender stereotypes and dichotomizing emotional frameworks that may actually intersect.

Paul Woodruff investigates a question that is pressing if you hold a certain sort of cognitivist theory: do emotions where the subject stands merely as an observer of the relevant events count as a distinct class? Woodruff's answer to the initial question is, sensibly, that spectator emotions are not distinct. Anger is anger, whether on one's own behalf or on behalf of another. Given Woodruff's theoretical commitments, this answer raises a number of problems. The subject of a genuine emotion (he says) is engaged in the subject matter, but spectators seem to lack engagement. Emotions prompt specific action, but spectators typically do not act. In virtue of being in emotional states we judge the world to be such­and­such, but as a spectator of fictions, we are often aware that it is not. If you share Woodruff's presuppositions, then you may be pleased to find someone grappling with these rarely discussed challenges. But if you doubt that emotions are judgments, or that they prompt specific actions, then Woodruff may seem to be solving problems of his own invention.

Noël Carroll pursues two different goals in his essay: to explain comic amusement, and to defend the view that it qualifies as an emotion. After canvassing the major alternatives in the literature, he settles on the view that amusement is, roughly, a response to pleasant incongruity. Carroll considers humorous examples ranging from wordplay to slapstick, and explains how his theory fits. He also covers a wide range of alternative theories and purported counterexamples, many of them by Roger Scruton. In defending the view that humorous amusement is an emotion, Carroll takes a very inclusive approach to emotion theory. He begins with an explanation rooted in the cognitivist tradition, before providing an argument that targets neo­Jamesian theorists. Some of his points could use further development. For example, he denies that amusement motivates action, but later argues that its function is to encourage reflection on the limitations of our cognitive strategies, which qualifies as a mental action. However, quibbles aside, Carroll successfully provides an introduction to the theory of humor, while integrating it with the philosophy of emotion.

Michael Stocker discusses a wide range of topics: the proper interpretation of William James, Chinese theory of emotions, higher­education pedagogy, and the role of emotions in the motivation of research. All of these threads are ostensibly unified by a shared project, analyzing the nature and importance of intellectual emotions. By 'intellectual emotions', Stocker means the emotions that concern intellectual matters and are elicited in the process of intellectual activities. He does not, ultimately, have a concrete position on whether they are intrinsically different from standard emotions. If they are not, then the topic loses a great deal of interest. It is possible to endlessly divide emotions into classes on the basis of how they arise, so we need to know why intellectual emotions, as a class, demand philosophical analysis. Near the end of the paper Stocker does supply such a reason, when he discusses whether emotions play an indispensable role in intellectual pursuits. He raises some interesting questions about different sources of motivation, but unfortunately does not develop them as much as a reader might like.

Jerome Neu offers an investigation of the meaning and value of authenticity. He does a remarkable job of developing a rigorous, philosophical argument that would not be out of place in a popular literary publication. In part this is due to Neu's choice of sources. He primarily responds to Sarte and Lionel Trilling, with reference as well to Austin, Nagel, and Freud. Neu understands authenticity in negative terms as the avoidance of lying, hypocrisy, and faking. Of the three, faking is the most problematic. Neu illustrates how commitment to values requires suppressing impulses. There is a fine line between free­expression and licentiousness. He also explores the difficulty of self­knowledge, given the forces within us that sometimes seek to obscure. Ironically, the essay was least engaging when it addressed emotions directly. Neu develops a cogent critique of Walton's view that we do not develop genuine emotions in response to fiction, but this section did not further develop the themes that made the rest of the essay so interesting.

Laurence Thomas takes up the role of love in self-knowledge. He makes the important observation that knowing your self requires knowing how you are seen by others and then argues that love can play a vital role in the epistemic endeavor. He usefully distinguishes the lessons of parental and non-parental love. Through unconditional love, parents help us discover our dignity as persons, whereas friends and lovers help us see those traits for which we are most worthy of esteem. The overall picture is compelling, but a bit rosy. One wonders whether love has a dark side. If those who love us inflate our worth, might the lessons of love be correlatively distorting? This raises worries about in-group bias and a tendency to accept prevailing social norms in deciding one's own worth.

Kathleen Higgins's paper is the most poignant, and also a philosophical highlight of the volume. She begins with an examination of Solomon's work on the norm to grieve when a loved one dies. She then takes on the counterpoint of this norm: the platitude that grieving should come to an end. As Solomon's widow, Higgins knows that there is no off switch to grief (those of us who knew Bob still mourn him deeply), but she also challenges the thesis that grief should end. The paper is full of insights. Higgins, for example, compares the death of a spouse to marriage, and describes how both subtly alter all one's other relationships. Her ultimate case for enduring grief draws on a narrative conception of emotions, which seems apt here, but also raises a question: can't grief be felt without the trappings of narrative? Episodes and essence can be dissociable, and you might feel the absence of a loved one without focusing on a particular event in the past.

Nancy Sherman's essay is one of the two most empirically engaged in the volume. Philosophers often base their analysis on hypothetical examples, whereas Sherman's investigation of guilt in war develops through close analysis of actual cases, with judicious reference to relevant theory. In much of the paper she documents the experiences of soldiers that she has interviewed. She identifies three types of guilt that they suffer from: accident guilt, luck guilt, and collateral damage guilt. These cases persistently raise two questions. Why do soldiers experience these kinds of guilt, since they are typically not actually culpable? Is there a way to relieve it? Sherman argues that the experience of guilt is a means of remaining whole, given the enormous disconnect between combat and normal life. It cannot be dispensed with, contrary to the stoic norms that prevail in the armed forces. Her analysis does not entirely dispel the mystery. It is still not clear why the suffering occurs in the form of guilt, rather than perhaps empathy or grief. But her narratives provide a useful basis for theorists interested in continuing the conversation.

The other essay that makes extensive contact with empirical results is Charles Nussbaum. He argues that Antonio Damasio's neurobiological theory of the self has implications for philosophical work on personality identity. Nussbaum thinks Damasio's view, which associates the self with subcortical systems that monitor bodily states, places pressure on Derek Parfit's neo-Lockean conjecture that identity requires psychological continuity. Here Nussbaum sides with Bernard Williams. In a celebrated thought experiment, Williams observed that we would dread being tortured by a mad scientist even if the scientist had promised to erase our memories. Nussbaum says we can make sense of this intuition if, following Damasio, we say the self is grounded in bodily experience rather than psychological continuity. With clever philosophical irony, Nussbaum also suggests that the bodily notion of self may vindicate Descartes against Lichtenstein's challenge that one cannot derive an ego from the cogito. The body is always present to us; therefore, if the self can be found in the body, the self is given in the stream of experience. But Nussbaum offers a crucial correction to the Cartesian inference. It is not thinking that gives us the body, but feeling. Here Nussbaum engages the emotions. Following Damasio and William James, he links emotions to experiences of patterned changes in the body. If the self has a bodily basis, then the self is present to us through the passions. This is a provocative and important idea, which deserves attention in the personal identity literature. Nussbaum's critique of Parfit might be challenged by arguing that the bodily self is synchronic, rather than diachronic.

The final essay is an engaging historical piece by John Deigh. A recent book by Thomas Dixon credits, Thomas Brown, an obscure 19th century associationist, with introducing the modern use of the term "emotion," which replaced earlier terms such as passions, affections, and sentiments. The new nomenclature, according to Dixon, laid the foundation for a science of the emotions. Pace Dixon, Deigh argues that the modern notion of emotions was inspired by Hume and then fully realized by William James (Brown's contribution being merely terminological). He further argues that for Hume 'emotion' refers to the felt violence of our passions, and that for James such feelings originate in physiological changes, which can be scientifically studied. Deigh then claims this empiricist picture came under attack with the cognitive revolution, suggesting that the picture inherited from Hume and James, which has been dominant in emotion science, is fatally flawed because it leaves out the intentionality of emotions, treating them instead on a par with twitches and tingles.

We tend to side with Hume and James. Hume argues that emotions (or passions) are not representations, and James largely ignores intentionality, though both have much to say about the elicitors of emotions and their functional effects. Against this anti-intentional orientation, recent philosophical work on the emotions (including all but Charles Nussbaum's in this volume) has tended to place emotions on the side of thought rather than the body. We think this has become dogma. One of us has argued (Shargel) that we may be able to jettison intentionality as unnecessary if we can specify when emotions arise, why they arise, and what they do. The other (Prinz) has argued that we might be able collapse the mind/body dichotomy and say that physiological states can carry meaning for an organism. If so, the cognitive revolution is not a remedy for empiricist errors but rather a Cartesian relapse. As Deigh notes in his introduction, Solomon's final writings on the emotions tried to broker an armistice between cognitive theories and embodied alternatives. A forward-looking volume on the emotions might make such mergers a focal point.