On Evidence in Philosophy

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William G. Lycan, On Evidence in Philosophy, Oxford University Press, 2019, 149pp., $50.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198829720.

Reviewed by Nathan Ballantyne, Fordham University


William G. Lycan has written a short but action-packed book about why philosophical arguments don't establish skeptical or radically revisionary claims concerning the nature of reality or our capacities as knowers and agents. A terrific volume, it is sure to annoy or maybe even infuriate many philosophers who think highly of their own arguments. I have never met Lycan, but in this book's pages I find some distinctive scholarly fingerprints. Here is a philosopher who is deeply reflective, self-critical, and able to impart insights with concision and wit. I recommend the book to all philosophers interested in methodology, skepticism, and knowledge. Lycan's observations about philosophy are smart and sometimes sobering. His book may instruct us about how one especially demanding type of philosophizing ought to be done, if it is to be done at all.

There's something ambitious about Lycan's book, even though he has tremendously low expectations for the success of philosophers' efforts, including his own. One of his central contentions is that philosophy does not overturn commonsense or well-established science. We've got perception, memory, science, and intuition; but the latter is not going to upend the former three. Lycan's outlook owes something to G. E. Moore's anti-skeptical writings. Moore's arguments against skepticism often appeal to autobiographical claims: that Moore had breakfast before lunch on a particular day, that he has two hands, that he has a living human body, and so forth. These bits and pieces are what philosophers now call Moorean commonsense. In Chapter 1, Lycan notes only one of Moore's handful of skeptical strategies actually works. But Lycan says that strategy is "brilliantly successful" (p. 6).

The idea Lycan latches onto is that we begin philosophical reflection taking various claims to be plausible or not. Then we consider the plausibility of claims in arguments purporting to establish the conclusions that skeptics, idealists, and other revisionists get all worked up about -- that there is no way to know whether there is an external world, that time is not real, that there are no relations, that no thinking being exists except oneself, and so on. Lycan contends that skeptical arguments purporting to undermine a commonsensical, science-based picture of the world and ourselves will ultimately lose in a head-to-head showdown with our commonsense beliefs. More exactly, Lycan thinks skeptics' arguments always include some abstract philosophical premise that has a lesser claim on our rational allegiance than our commonsense beliefs. Forced to decide between whether it's more plausible that (i) we know we have hands or (ii) we don't know there is an external world, we know how to choose.

The core chapters illustrate Lycan's Moorean anti-skepticism -- a single theme with variations. In various "credibility faceoffs" (p. 34), skeptical and revisionary arguments get walloped over and over by good old-fashioned commonsense, at least in Lycan's estimation. Lycan examines arguments for doubting our knowledge of the external world (Chapter 2), arguments for the thesis that no creature has any belief, desire, or intention (Chapter 3), and arguments for the incompatibility of freedom with determinism (Chapter 4). These chapters comprise mini tours of debates in epistemology, philosophy of mind, and free will, showing Lycan's impressive reach into many literatures.

"Science can correct common sense," Lycan writes, but "metaphysics and philosophical 'intuition' can only throw spitballs" (p. 12). He says in an aside that a cynic once defined "faith" as "believing to be true what one knows to be false" and adds that Moore might have characterized skeptical philosophy as "believing to be false what one knows to be true" (p. 14, fn 19). Lycan's book is a statement and defense of what it means to be seriously constrained in our philosophical efforts -- unable to significantly revise a picture given to us by science and commonsense. His Moorean anti-skepticism lets him reject radical skeptical claims, but it curbs expectations for what philosophical arguments can do: "a felicitous explanatory coordination between common sense and science is the best that philosophy can hope to achieve" (pp. 2-3). He defends anti-skepticism about many topics by embracing skepticism about philosophy's power to establish significant claims.

If Lycan is right, philosophers trying to establish "interesting, exciting conclusions" (p. 82) have some explaining to do: their arguments do not convince. What's wrong with these people? Well, let me note that Lycan isn't merely tut-tutting or wagging his finger at others. He freely admits his own occasional overconfidence in the value of philosophical argument. In Chapter 5, for instance, he says that for a long time he failed to recognize the viability of one much-maligned theory: Cartesian dualism. Lycan reports that he has endorsed materialism about the mind "all my adult life, since first I considered the mind-body issue" (p. 66). In the 1980s, Lycan wrote a book that dismissed dualism by rehearsing stock counterarguments (Lycan 1987). But later on, while teaching a graduate seminar at the University of North Carolina at Chapel Hill in 2006, he decided to play the role "of a committed dualist as energetically as I could." (One hopes that, like Descartes, he wore a wig.) Taking on the mantle of the dualist was, he says, "a strange feeling, something like being a cat burglar for a few months" (p. 66, fn 8). (One hopes that, like a cat burglar, he wore a black ski mask.) Lycan's role-playing revealed to him the defects of arguments against dualism. He says he had overestimated the efficacy of those arguments and compares his materialist perspective to a political or religious ideology: "my own faith in materialism," he confesses, "is based on science-worship" (p. 68, fn 11).

Lycan's anti-skepticism sets limits on what philosophers can rightly claim to have established about many standard questions. But what accounts for the fact philosophers routinely do believe their arguments are powerful, knocking down rival viewpoints? Lycan offers diagnostic suggestions in the form of what he dubs "cynical sociophilosophical observations" -- CSOs for short. Consider a few CSOs, minus Lycan's further commentary and elaboration:

  • "no philosopher has ever proportioned her/his belief to the evidence" (p. 67)
  • "we always hold our opponents to higher standards of argument than we observe ourselves" (p. 67)
  • "Any interesting philosophical view faces tough objections, that can be answered by one who really holds the view." (p. 75)
  • "If you can succeed in placing the burden of proof on your opponent, the game is 99 percent won." (p. 75)
  • "on any philosophical topic, the person who propounds an analysis is going to get creamed. Philosophical analyses virtually never work, but are lacerated by counterexample after counterexample." (p. 53, cf. p. 77)
  • "When working in one area, we feel perfectly free to presuppose positions in other areas that are (at best) highly controversial among practitioners in those areas." (p. 77.
  • "We accept deductive arguments mainly when we already believe their conclusions." (p. 80)

Lycan uses his CSOs to try to make better sense of the endemic presumption among philosophers that their arguments pass muster. If you've ever seen philosophers at a conference, confidently carrying on about their arguments, which you find unimpressive; or if you've felt your prior opinions tugging at you while considering flawless-looking counterarguments; or if you've noticed how hard it is to get real clarity about the answers to philosophical questions, you may find some of Lycan's CSOs fairly plausible. I certainly do. Still, I wonder: how well do the CSOs fit together with Moorean anti-skepticism?

Supposing the CSOs are correct, we might naturally expect Lycan's book is yet another installment in a long series of flops. If, for instance, philosophers hold their opponents to "higher standards of argument" than they hold themselves to, why not suspect Lycan has unfairly let himself off easy? If objections to "any interesting philosophical view . . . can be answered by one who really holds the view," why not expect skeptics and revisionist philosophers will have reasonable replies to Lycan's anti-skepticism? And if "no philosopher has ever proportioned her/his belief to the evidence," what can be said for Lycan's own responsiveness to his evidence? We may easily worry about the overall stability of Lycan's position given the CSOs. Lycan does not explicitly address that issue, but he won't be at all surprised by it, I figure. As he says, "Every substantive philosophical theory the world has ever known faces formidable objections and, more to the point, has been reasonably thought to have been refuted. So too with my own views" (p. 85). So too with his Moorean strategy?

All of this can be brought into sharper focus. The worry becomes clearer when we look at one principle Lycan proposes:

Principle of Humility: if you maintain that [proposition] P, but others who are as intelligent and perceptive as you and have given as much consideration to the matter and are not biased in any nonepistemic way deny that P on the basis of reasons, [then] you do not know that P. (p. 88)

The Principle of Humility raises interpretive questions. Suppose we accept some proposition and it is true. Is the Principle's antecedent satisfied when it is an objective fact that intelligent, perceptive opponents deny our view on the basis of reasons? In that case (and assuming the Principle is correct), we would lose our knowledge whenever there are intelligent, perceptive opponents in the world, even opponents unknown to us. Or, alternatively, is the Principle's antecedent satisfied only when we know there are such opponents? If so, the Principle says we lose knowledge because we know particular things about our opponents. Or we could ask whether the Principle's antecedent is satisfied when we believe rationally (but possibly falsely) that our opponents deny our view on the basis reasons. Lycan's discussion of the Principle does not settle things, but I ignore that for now.

Let's now consider Lycan's Moorean anti-skeptical strategy in light of the Principle of Humility. There might be some difficulty joining the two together. First of all, Lycan doesn't think the Moorean strategy stands or falls with the truth of any general philosophical thesis (see, for example, pp. 12 and 19-20 for his denial of the "Very Strong Position"). Instead, he just thinks that in all of the "credibility faceoffs" he has seen, skeptical propositions lose to commonsense ones (p. 12, fn 17). So, we can take the following proposition to encapsulate Lycan's commitment: the Moorean anti-skeptical strategy succeeds in cases C1-Cn. Lycan accepts that proposition.[1] Presumably, he has written his book because some professional philosophers oppose Moorean anti-skepticism. These philosophers presumably think the strategy is somehow flawed. I suspect that Lycan will be inclined to concede that these opponents are as "intelligent and perceptive" as he is and whatever else is required by the Principle's antecedent. It follows that Lycan does not know the relevant proposition.[2]

Can Moorean anti-skeptics be humble about their anti-skepticism? Or does the strategy fail when we're humble about it? Suppose we intend to use the Moorean strategy to save our commonsense belief, B, from skeptical challenge. We take ourselves to know B is true, but if the skeptical challenge sticks, we don't know B is true. Let's assume the Moorean strategy is not known to be true, because our knowledge of the strategy is defeated by the Principle of Humility. Now what? If our Moorean strategy is not known, we should arguably be unsure about the epistemic status of B. The fact that the strategy is not known appears to "rub off" on B. And so the skeptical challenge is not vanquished after all. The Moorean strategy doesn't seem to be as effective as Lycan says it is.

Lycan could pump the brakes, insisting that opponents who reject the Moorean strategy are not as "intelligent and perceptive" as he is. In other words, one way to defend the strategy is to be arrogant about the strategy itself. Or maybe Lycan could discard the assumption that his opponents deny his anti-skepticism "on the basis of reasons." In discussing Moore's "brilliantly successful" argument, he says: "I believe Moore has made it highly probable that no good reason has ever been given for accepting skepticism" (p. 27). So perhaps Lycan could also say that no (good) reason has ever been given for rejecting Moore's argument. What's unclear to me is whether Lycan's Mooreanism is equivalent to a philosophical position or whether it instead counts as mere commonsense or an undeniable truth about inference (cf. Lycan's discussion at pp. 19-20 of an argument due to Susanna Rinard).

So, I am not so sure how to think about the stability of Lycan's overall project. While I find much to admire in his discussion of CSOs and humility-promoting reasoning, cynically humble ideas are hard to contain. Using such ideas to undermine radical skepticism is like trying to save your house from a wildfire by burning your garage and backyard patio to create a firebreak; it can be done but, if you're not careful, everything may go up in flames. Insofar as we use these ideas to explain why arguments often fail, we should worry that our own arguments fail, too. The question here is whether Lycan's Mooreanism is fallible and, if so, whether its own fallibility prevents it from fending off skepticism.

As I close this review, I'll propose a CSO of my own. But first a question: What sort of philosopher could write a book like this one? It is a book rich in arguments and observations about a wide range of philosophical subfields. Its author is not a narrow subspecialist. Over the years, Lycan has spent considerable energy thinking about knowledge and mind, logic and language, examining both contemporary and historical sources. He avoids the convenient narrowness of much hyperspecialized philosophy today. He's articulating a big idea that bears on method, applicable in any subfield. He gives us this pithy summary: "I advocate a picture of philosophy as a very wide explanatory reflective equilibrium incorporating common sense, science, and our firmest intuitions on any topic -- and nothing more, not ever" (p. 4). The book works out that idea with style and power.

When I began graduate school around fifteen years ago, I remember hearing about a type of philosopher called a LEMMing -- somebody working in the philosophy of Language, Epistemology, Metaphysics, and the philosophy of Mind.[3] Some LEMMings even worked in all of those areas. This LEMMing business was supposed to be central to the discipline, because it interrogated general questions about reality and human persons, and prominent practitioners plied their trade in these subfields. What exists? Are we free? What do we know? What am I? Nowadays, I don't hear about LEMMings too often and I don't think many younger philosophers see themselves as striving to do whatever LEMMings do. But I would wager that Lycan is among the best working representatives of that brand of analytic philosophy. I studied his book as an epistemologist who knows embarrassingly little about issues at a distance from my home subfield. If I spent more time reading the philosophy of language or metaphysics, or the philosophy of technology for that matter, there would be less time for writing epistemology. And younger philosophers all know that reading outside of your field does not get you a career. It just doesn't pay the bills.

Here then is my CSO: The pressures of professionalization on up-and-coming philosophers mean that few will have the opportunity or inclination to pursue expansive, integrative projects nor will they develop into the sort of philosophers who can eventually write a book like Professor Lycan's. Not all philosophy needs to be Lycanesque to be worth studying. But suppose our aim is to understand the meaning and implications of views we hold in specialized debates. We need a kind of synoptic model to follow here and Lycan offers one. How do all of these things we think hang together? That is the burden of metaphilosophy.[4]

Allow me to end by quoting an actual sentence contained in this fine little book: "Buy Lycan's book immediately, in hardback" (p. 118).


For helpful input on an earlier version, I am grateful to Johnny Brennan, William Lycan, Andrew Rotondo, Amy Seymour, Craig Warmke, Shane Wilkins, Benjamin Wilson, and August Yu.


Ballantyne, Nathan. 2019. Knowing Our Limits. New York: Oxford University Press.

Christensen, David. 2013. "Epistemic Modesty Defended." In The Epistemology of Disagreement: New Essays. Edited by David Christensen and Jennifer Lackey, 77-97. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Elga, Adam. 2010. "How to Disagree about How to Disagree." In Disagreement. Edited by Ted Warfield and Richard Feldman, 175-186. New York: Oxford University Press.

Lycan, William G. 1987. Consciousness. Cambridge, MA: The MIT Press.

Lycan, William G. 2017. "On Evidence in Philosophy." Proceedings and Addresses of The American Philosophical Association Volume 91 (November 2017): 102-117.

Pittard, John. 2015. "Resolute Conciliationism." The Philosophical Quarterly 65 (260): 442-463.

[1] For reasons I won't get into here, we need not assume Lycan believes it, though he may; see pp. 84-85.

[2] We could instead make the proposition at issue the Principle of Humility, but I won't say anything about straightforward self-undermining of that Principle. (For discussion of such issues, see Elga 2010, Christensen 2013, Pittard 2015, and Ballantyne 2019, Chapter 10.)

[3] The term was coined by Brian Weatherson in a blog post from 2004.

[4] I should add that Lycan might well embrace a CSO in the vicinity of this one. In his Dewey Lecture, delivered at the 2017 Eastern Division meeting of the American Philosophical Association in Baltimore, Lycan noted that "specialization and professionalization" are together "the main cause of the disappearance of Greats," philosophers who "changed the course of philosophy itself" (2017, pp. 106, 107). He adds that professionalization is "deeper and more insidious, with a bigger downside" than specialization (2017, p. 107). What he said next is worth quoting in full:

What do graduate admissions committees look for in an applicant? Demonstrated accomplishment in philosophy. (They don't take music majors anymore. [NB: earlier in the lecture, Lycan notes he majored in math and music during college.]) That's understandable; what better predictor for success in philosophy graduate study? And nowadays undergraduate majors are encouraged to behave like little graduate students; they write papers on the professional model that sometimes are even published in real philosophy journals. But the result is predictable: their topics, their styles of argument, and their conception of philosophy itself are inherited directly from their teachers, and they self-perpetuate. (2017, p. 107, emphasis in original)

That sounds right to me, but I wouldn't complain for half a second if someone inherited a little philosophical style from Lycan.