On Friendship

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Alexander Nehamas, On Friendship, Basic Books, 2016, 291pp., $26.99 (hbk), ISBN 978046508292.

Reviewed by Neera K. Badhwar, University of Oklahoma


On Friendship offers riches to both philosophers and the general reader interested in a philosophical understanding of friendship. Instead of numbered propositions or characters called "A" and "B", Nehamas presents his arguments in prose that is both literary and informal, making copious use of examples from art and literature as well as his own life.

Nehamas' main points are:

  • Instrumental relationships, such as Aristotle's so-called utility and pleasure philiai, are not friendships in the modern sense.
  • A good friendship is a close friendship, and not, contra Aristotle, a virtuous friendship. Virtue can be irrelevant to friendship or even in conflict with it.
  • Montaigne was right that we cannot give a complete explanation of why we love our friends. Neither some special set of properties, nor all their properties (and our own), can explain why.
  • Friendship is "double-faced" -- it can be good for us as well as bad.
  • Different friends bring out different aspects of our personality. This raises the question of what it means to love our friends for themselves, and whether there is any such thing as "the self".

Nehamas starts, like so many others, with Aristotle. He challenges two of Aristotle's claims that, he states, practically everyone agrees with: that friendship is an "unalloyed good" and that there are three types of friendship: utility, pleasure, and virtue. Nehamas agrees that friendship is a great good, but argues that it can also be a great bad. As for the three types of friendship, he claims that there are no virtue friendships because there are no perfectly virtuous people, and utility and pleasure friendships are not really friendships at all in the modern sense. Nor are many of the other relationships that Aristotle refers to as philiai, such as parent-child relationships, the relationship of citizens, and the relationship of all human beings to each other, insofar as they wish each other well and act accordingly. For this reason, Nehamas refuses to translate philia as friendship.

Let us first see why Nehamas thinks that utility and pleasure philiai are not really friendships. In such relationships, Aristotle tells us, two (or more) people like each other and wish each other well for each other's sake, as required by all philiai. However, they do so on account of their mutually useful or pleasurable properties, and these properties are incidental to who the philoi are, in the sense that they can cease to be useful or pleasant to each other as their needs or interests change without becoming different persons. This is not true of virtue friendships, for a person's virtues are part of who he is -- maybe even all of who he is for Aristotle. The mutual goodwill and pleasurable or useful activities of philoi with or towards each other are, accordingly, limited by their desire that their philoi continue to be useful or pleasurable. Hence, Nehamas argues, although they wish each other well for each other's sake, they do not do so for each other's own sake. Their relationships are instrumental, hence not friendships in the modern sense.

I am not so sure about this last claim. There is no one modern understanding of friendship, as there isn't of most important concepts. It is common for people to think of their drinking companions or tennis partners as friends, even though they would stop seeing each other if their friends stopped drinking or playing tennis. The same is true of neighbors who help each other when the need arises, but whose contact is limited to times when one of them has a need. So long as their mutual goodwill goes beyond the goodwill that (presumably) they have towards people in general, their relationship goes beyond the impersonal relationships that they have with hair cutters, handymen, and so on, and "friend" is, at least, not an inappropriate term for describing it.

Nehamas' more serious disagreement is with Aristotle's claim that the best friendships must be based on the virtue of the friends, and must therefore always be good for the friends. One reason he disagrees is that he believes that there are no perfectly virtuous people. This is true, but as John Cooper has pointed out, Aristotle calls the friendships of imperfectly virtuous people also virtue friendships. The more important reason Nehamas disagrees with Aristotle is that he thinks that the best friendships are close friendships, and moral virtue is often irrelevant to, or even in conflict with, such friendships. For contrary to Aristotle's claim, it is possible for bad people to be genuine friends. For example, two gangsters can admire each other for their vices and be friends on account of those vices.

I agree with Nehamas that bad people can be genuine friends on account of their shared badness. It doesn't follow, however, that moral virtue is irrelevant to their friendship. On the contrary, their friendship demands that they have virtuous dispositions and act virtuously with each other, limiting their vices to other people. To use Nehamas' own example, their ability to obey orders and execute them unquestioningly is compatible with their friendship only if it doesn't extend to obeying orders to harm, betray, or kill each other. Even bad people's friendship requires mutual goodwill, trustworthiness, courage, honesty, kindness, and justice. This is what I've sometimes called "the inherent morality" of friendship. Aristotle thought the vicious were not capable of friendship because he thought that a vicious person must be vicious all the way through, in conflict with himself and with everyone else, filled with self-loathing and loathing of others. But if people's vices are not necessarily global, as I have argued elsewhere, then we have no reason to believe that no bad person is capable of a close friendship.

Nehamas takes up the theme of the relationship between friendship and morality again in Chapter 6, where he defends a bolder thesis. Using the movie Thelma and Louise as an example, he argues that the immoral actions of the two main characters -- murder, robbery, intimidation, and imprisonment - are essential to the goodness of their friendship. Before we consider this claim, it's important to note that Thelma and Louise start down this path not out of friendship, but out of bad judgment, impulsiveness, and irresponsibility, and these create problems for themselves as well as for each other. But I will assume for the sake of argument that even though their actions are wrong and, ultimately, harmful for them, they do them out of friendship, for each other's own sake. By hypothesis, doing the morally right thing would have meant betraying or abandoning and intentionally harming each other. And a relationship in which people do this to each other is not a friendship. In this limited sense, then, it's true that "their friendship is a good [to them], not despite the fact that it leads them to kill, rob, intimidate, and destroy but because of it" (195). It's also true that through these actions Thelma and Louise assert their choice of liberty over life, and that Thelma becomes more independent and the equal of Louise over the course of their two days together. But it's equally important to note that their friendship would have been a far greater good had they had better judgment and not created situations in which doing the right thing by each other required doing the wrong thing by others. As it is, they end up destroying not only other people, but also themselves. The larger lesson is not that morality or virtue is irrelevant to friendship or in conflict with it, but that the moral demands of the friendship of bad, or simply not very good, people often conflict with their moral obligations to other people. Had they been good people, neither would have regarded doing the right thing as a betrayal of their friendship.

Some of the most interesting parts of Nehamas' book deal with what it means to care for a friend for herself. What is this self that is the object of love or liking in friendship? No list of qualities can capture what we care for in a friend, because the same qualities in another person fail to do the trick. It's not just her sense of humor, her intelligence, her curiosity, and so on, but these qualities expressed in the way she expresses them -- her style - that make the difference. Although this point has been made before, Nehamas' way of making it is entirely original. He illustrates what he means by a friend's qualities expressed in the way he expresses them with a story about an unexpected action by his close friend, Tom. If someone asked Nehamas why Tom was his friend, he would, among other things, tell this story about him. But no matter how much detail he gave to this and other stories about Tom, it wouldn't suffice to fully explain, even to himself, why Tom was his friend. Just as we can't fully convey in words why we find something beautiful, so we can't fully convey in words why we find someone lovable. Words leave something out in both cases, and what they leave out in the latter case is part of the self. This is not only because the self that is the object of love is complex, but also because it exists only in that relationship. Different aspects of the self are important for different friends. And every friendship changes both friends. Hence every friendship, in Nehamas' words, "is a unique combination of two souls, impossible to duplicate" (121). By way of a discussion of Montaigne's essay on friendship, Nehamas concludes with Montaigne that the only "explanation" one can give for a friendship is: "Because it was he, because it was I." (119).

To love a friend for himself is also "a commitment to the future, a sense that there is more to know here, and a promise that what I still don't know will be worth learning" (133). It is to wish to know him better, based on the sense that this will be good for both of us. To love a friend for himself is to love him for what he is and for what he can become, partly as a result of our friendship. It is also "to hope that we will love what we ourselves will become because of our relationship" (138). Friendship is open-ended, like a "living metaphor". When we start feeling that there is nothing more to learn, that our future will be like our past, our friendship comes to an end.

It is this forward-looking feature of friendship, says Nehamas, that makes friendship risky. We lay ourselves open to the friend, trusting that she will be good for us, but not knowing how she will affect us. We can't be sure that we will not become someone we would have hated to become before this friend entered our lives -- indeed, we can't be sure that we will not become someone who will actually come to like this new self because our judgment has been degraded.

There is truth in what Nehamas says, but I think he exaggerates the risk. Decent people choose decent friends, and in adulthood decent friends don't change for the worse just like that, that is, without the intervention of extraordinary events, such as the sudden acquisition of political power, great wealth, or fame, or the befalling of great misfortune. The risk Nehamas writes about is real in a great erotic passion for an unsavory character, or in enthrallment with a charismatic political or religious leader, but not in a close, non-erotic friendship of two decent people. For one of the marks of a decent person is concern for her own character. In not distinguishing between the close friendships of decent people and those of bad or weak people, Nehamas overlooks the fact that the risk he talks about depends to a large extent on the character of the friends in question.

In ChapterĀ 5, Nehamas turns his attention to a little-discussed topic, the grief that results from the breakup of a friendship, or from the realization that the friendship was based on deception or illusion. This grief is one of the potential harms of friendship. He illustrates this with a fascinating discussion of the play, Art, by Yasmina Reza. Art is about three friends, Serge, Marc, and Yvan, whose friendship is threatened when Serge spends a fortune to buy a painting that seems, to the other two, to be just a white canvas. Marc thinks that Serge has become pretentious, thanks to his pretentious new friends -- or maybe never was the person Marc took him to be. Serge, for his part, finds Marc to be a harsh and pretentious know-it-all for dismissing the painting the way he does, and for showing no regard for their friendship. By contrast, Yvan merely thinks that, although he himself doesn't understand the painting, Serge must because he is a sophisticated art-lover. Marc, however, takes Yvan's tolerance to be obsequiousness. Yvan, he says, is unwilling to tell Serge what he thinks of the painting in order to avoid a fight. Part of what is going on with Marc, though, is jealousy: he feels that the painting has replaced him in Serge's love. Marc and Serge both react to each other's (and Yvan's) words and actions as indicative of a character flaw, and feel shaken as a result. Was their friendship based on illusions about each other? Nehamas' description makes the characters' sense of loss and betrayal palpable. The end of the friendship isn't just the loss of the friend or friends, but also a partial loss of self. In the end, they save their friendship, but each of them keeps some of his thoughts about the others concealed. Even the closest friends cannot tell each other everything without jeopardizing their friendship. In this, says Nehamas, Kant was right and Aristotle wrong.

The play also illustrates another refrain of Nehamas' book: there is no one, settled self that we discover over time. Rather, we continually shape each other and ourselves through our friendships, and who we are in one friendship is not who we are in another: different aspects of our persona are salient in different friendships. Like Nietzsche, Nehamas thinks that we make ourselves into individuals by creating coherent selves with distinct styles. But unlike Nietzsche, he thinks that we do so primarily through the ordinary, everyday interactions of friends, not by our own efforts.

My review has addressed only the highlights of Nehamas' book; there is a great deal more for the reader to admire and savor, both in content and in style.