On Global Justice

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Mathias Risse, On Global Justice, Princeton University Press, 2012, 465pp., $39.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780691142692.

Reviewed by Christian Barry, Australian National University


The literature on global justice is constituted by a range of interconnected and overlapping philosophical discussions about the ethical norms that should govern the interactions between people, states, corporations and other agents acting in the global arena, as well as the design of the social institutions that link them together. These discussions have focused on determining the moral duties that affluent people have to the poor abroad, the applicability of standards of justice at the global level, and the nature of responsibilities with respect to policy issues such as immigration, climate change, and international trade. Mathias Risse's new book is unique in this literature by virtue of its scope and ambition. Risse develops and defends a wide-ranging and original account of global justice and seeks to spell out its implications for a broad range of practical concerns. He has many interesting things to say about the topics with which he engages, and thus makes an important contribution to this fast-evolving literature. While the book is quite long and its arguments complex, it is fluidly written, erudite, and engages imaginatively with the history of political thought, as well as with contemporary works on justice.

Risse calls his approach to global justice "pluralist internationalism" (p. 2). A pluralist internationalist rejects the idea that principles of justice that are appropriate when evaluating social arrangements within a state -- for example, Rawls's justice as fairness, or some other egalitarian principle -- should be applied globally. Risse's view is at odds with positions such as those advocated by Charles Beitz and Thomas Pogge (in their early work), and more recently by Simon Caney, Pablo Gilabert, Darrel Moellendorf, Laura Valentini and Lea Ypi, which would place limits on permissible global inequalities at a fundamental level. However, Risse also rejects the notion that principles of justice should only be applied to states. He thus rejects views (suggested by Thomas Nagel and others) that maintain that we possess duties of justice to compatriots, but only duties of beneficence or humanitarian concern to non-compatriots. On Risse's view, "the state has a special place in accounts of justice. Domestic justice -- justice within the state -- and global justice have different standards, and the former are more egalitarian" (p. 2). Pluralist internationalism is thus "a view of global justice 'between' two standard views, the principles of justice either apply only within states or else apply to all human beings" (p. 17). For the pluralist internationalist, states are normatively peculiar when it comes to justice, but are not the only entities to which justice applies (p. 52).

Why should we care whether principles of justice are applicable to some domain? To be sure, justice is surely not the only standard that is relevant to social evaluation and normative assessment -- Risse himself emphasizes that it belongs to the broader category of what he calls "demands of reasonable conduct" (p. 6). We care because claims of justice are ordinarily taken to be extremely stringent (p. 5), and thus not easily overridden by other concerns. Other demands of reasonable conduct may not be so exacting. Pluralist internationalism does not hold that the principles of justice that apply globally are less stringent than those that apply to the state -- global justice is not watered down justice (p. 50). Rather, it asserts that the content of principles of justice and the claims and duties to which they give rise are different. In particular, the content of principles of justice that apply to states involve demands for socioeconomic equality (Risse endorses a broadly Rawlsian perspective on justice within a state), while the content of standards of justice that apply globally do not.

What is the rationale for pluralist internationalism? According to Risse, we should begin reflection on justice by considering what he calls the grounds of justice. A ground of justice refers to the reasons why some claim of justice applies. He argues that there is a range of grounds of justice -- five in all -- which makes him a pluralist. The five grounds he invokes are: 1) shared membership in states; 2) common humanity; 3) humanity's collective ownership of the earth; 4) membership in the global order; and 5) subjection to the global trading system. Whether and to what extent a justice claim of a particular type applies to some domain depends on the presence or absence of these grounds within it. Risse further distinguishes between relational and non-relational grounds of justice. A ground is relational if it applies only to those who stand in some "essentially practice-mediated relation" (p. 8). Grounds 1, 4, and 5, are thus relational, while 2 and 3 are non-relational. Pluralist internationalists thus reject non-relationism about justice, while affirming that there are non-relational grounds of justice. They also reject relationism about justice, while affirming that there are relational grounds of justice.[1]

Some grounds of justice apply only to states -- specifically shared membership in states -- while others apply more broadly. That different grounds of justice are present in varying extents in different contexts, Risse argues, motivates pluralism concerning the content of justice in these contexts. Note that it is somewhat misleading to refer to these five features as grounds of justice, given that the claim that each is relevant to the content of justice requires further argument. And it's a good thing, too, since Risse's argument for pluralist internationalism would otherwise be damagingly circular. It clearly won't do to justify the claim that some standard of justice applies only within a state by pointing out that only within a state does the ground of shared membership within a state obtain. As we shall see, Risse further grounds the significance of shared membership in a state in relations of coercion and cooperation, while other grounds such as collective ownership are ultimately justified by a conception of human basic needs and their moral importance.

What are the implications of pluralist internationalism? An early review of Risse's book, titled "Help Yourself,"[2] claimed that his account of justice would essentially leave the world as it is. And global justice theorists are likely to seize on its more conservative features -- specifically its scepticism concerning reforms of the system of sovereign states and its rejection of global egalitarianism. However, it would be a mistake to overlook the fact that Risse's pluralist internationalism is a progressive view that is quite revisionary of current practice in a number of important respects.

For example, if Risse's account of justice were to be realized, each country would be governed (domestically) by something like Rawls's two principles of justice, making it very doubtful that anything like the kinds of socioeconomic inequalities characteristic of most modern societies, rich or poor, could be sustained. Further, each state would act responsibility in its role as trustee for future generations, including better stewardship of natural resources (Ch. 9) and efforts to mitigate and adapt to climate change (Ch. 10). In addition, each state would, so long as it possessed the means, act responsibly to discharge a duty to assist poorer states (according to Risse, this would most sensibly take the form of helping to ensure that good institutions would take root or be sustained in them) (Ch.4). Moreover, states would ensure that the benefits of the global trading system would be more equitably distributed. In particular, states would craft their trade policies in ways that were sensitive to their effects on foreigners (Ch.14). In the matter of immigration, many people who lack opportunities to reliably meet their basic needs where they live would have a right to move to countries where they could do so.

Also, if states acted not only justly, but in accordance with the full range of demands of reasonable conduct as Risse understands them, at least some wealthy countries -- those who currently underuse resources -- would adopt much more liberal immigration regimes to admit people who live in countries where there is overuse (Ch.8). All people would possess immunity rights against social arrangements that unduly restrict their opportunities to meet their basic needs (p. 134). Measures would be put in place to ensure access to essential medicines (Ch.12) and to promote basic labour standards abroad (Ch.13). So a world in which Risse's ;plural internationalist vision were realized would look very different indeed from our own, and would be a much more attractive world at that.

This does not of course show that the pluralist internationalist position is superior to competing accounts of global justice, including those maintaining that, at a fundamental level, justice places limits on permissible global inequalities. To defend pluralist internationalism against its competitors, Risse must do three things. First, he must show that the five grounds he identifies (and only they) are relevant to determining the applicability and content of principles of justice -- providing grounds for the grounds, as it were. Second, he must show how they determine the content of standards. Third, he must demonstrate (empirically) the manner in which these grounds apply in our world at present, and show that these implications are morally plausible. Limits of space prevent detailed examination of the full range of the arguments offered in this wide-ranging book. However, I will raise some challenges for two important lines of argument within it: that seeking to demonstrate that the state is normatively peculiar, and that defending an interpretation of the idea that human beings collectively own the world's original resources.

Why should shared membership in states be treated as a ground of justice, one that has such significant implications for the content of justice demands? According to Risse (building here on work by Michael Blake, Richard Miller, Nagel, and Andrea Sangiovanni), the normative peculiarity of states is based on two features: their coercive power over the lives of their members and a special sort of cooperation that is involved in them (pp. 74-78). Risse does not claim that coercion is unique to the state, as some so-called statists have -- he considers this claim implausible, given increasing global interconnectedness (p. 48) -- but only that the manner and extent of the coercion employed within a state is special.

In particular, the exercise of coercion within a state is unmediated and more thoroughgoing than coercion exercised outside of the state -- it is profound and pervasive (p. 39). Individuals have no reasonable alternative other than to comply with the coercion exercised by the state. States can issue threats, and possess "unmediated access to bodies and assets" (p. 26). However, what is most important, for Risse is that such coercion regulates relationships between individuals who are themselves intensely cooperative. Primary goods within a state are provided through the cooperation of all (pp. 30, 37-40). Why does the presence of these features make egalitarian justice appropriate? According to Risse, "the fundamental alikeness of members as far as reciprocity and immediacy are concerned creates a default position for an equal division of social primary goods" (p. 39).

Suppose we grant that cooperation and coercion are grounds of justice, and that they are more profoundly present within states than globally. This would mean that non-relationismabout justice would be false. However, it would not show that it would be inappropriate to adopt egalitarian standards of justice globally. Thoroughgoing cooperation and coercion might be sufficient but not necessary to ground demands of egalitarian justice. One might hold, for example, that the fact that we coexist under a set of global institutional arrangements -- international property regimes and specific configurations of the sovereign state -- that are coercively enforced (albeit by a plurality of agents) and whose effects are pervasive and present from birth suffices to ground egalitarian principles of justice globally, or that the importance of mitigating or eliminating sheer brute luck is itself sufficient to do so. Note that such arguments need not assert that exactly the same principles apply globally and domestically, but only that factors that are present globally are sufficient to ground some egalitarian principle. Why does Risse think that the thoroughgoing kinds of cooperation and coercion characteristic of states are necessary for the applicability of egalitarian standards of justice? It would seem that it is because he considers egalitarian principles to be "especially demanding" (pp. 25, 42).

Explaining his view he says that it "holds that nothing as egalitarian or demanding as Rawls's account of justice applies outside states" (p. 10). The idea is that only certain types of coercion and cooperation are enough to support such demanding standards (pp.60-62). But in what sense are egalitarian principles demanding? They may be demanding in the sense that some might fare better under institutions that are not guided by egalitarian principles than they do under egalitarian institutions. On this view, it demands much of these people to comply with institutions supported by egalitarian principles. But  it will also be true that there are many people -- for example those who enjoy a significantly inferior range of opportunities -- who will consider institutions that are not regulated by egalitarian principles to be very demanding of them.

It can be argued that there is some sense in which complaints of demandingness have more weight when they are made against institutions endorsed by egalitarian principles than against others, but this needs to be shown independently. We surely cannot assume that laissez faire institutions are somehow the natural baseline, departures from which stand in need of special justification. One might argue that institutions called for by egalitarian principles are demanding in the sense that they are more difficult to establish and maintain. But if such difficulties make it the case that the egalitarian principles are poorly served by institutions that aim to promote equality, then these institutions would not satisfy such principles. In any case, this is a problem of feasibility, not ideal theory, and Risse makes it clear that he does not wish to rely on it to reject global egalitarian views (p. 58).

In a few places Risse claims that relations within the state generate "redistributive pressure" (58), and he explicitly refers to Rawls's difference principle as redistributive. Perhaps the idea is that egalitarian institutions are demanding since they demand taking some people's assets to benefit others. But as Rawls scholars like Pogge and Samuel Freeman have pointed out, this is a misleading way of representing the difference principle (and many other principles that would place limits on permissible departures from equality). The difference principle constrains the choice of social arrangements -- rules governing what kinds of things can be owned (and by whom), how they can be acquired, transferred, relinquished, and forfeited, how markets and the production systems are structured, the manner in which decisions concerning trade policy and the monetary system are made, and so on -- which give rise to patterns of holdings -- and does not specify circumstances under which holdings can be forcibly redistributed, post hoc, by the state.[3] As Liam Murphy and Nagel have pointed out, it is a mistake to think of people's holdings (such as pre-tax income) as things they have independently of institutional arrangements, including the tax system, since they partly owe their existence to such arrangements.[4] It is misleading to view transfer mechanisms as redistributing things that antecedently belong to people, and thus as demanding in ways that call for special justification.

Those who advocate egalitarian principles for assessing the global order can also reject the premise that their views are overly demanding and redistributive. Rather, they insist that the choice of practices that give rise to holdings in the first place should be designed in ways that are sensitive to the kinds of inequalities that they tend to generate. Risse writes, "Especially the difference principle is very demanding, asking individuals to comply with socioeconomic arrangements that put differences among them into the service of all." (p. 59). But defenders of the difference principle -- applied domestically or globally -- should resist this characterization of their views. These principles should not be interpreted as demanding that differences between people be harnessed to promote the good of all, but that the rules through which people can gain things through their efforts not be designed in a way that give rise to prospects for the least advantaged that are inferior to what the least advantaged would enjoy under feasible alternative arrangements. They are focused on the pre-distribution of rights, rather than the re-distribution of wealth. I should note that none of this shows that egalitarian alternatives to pluralist internationalism are justified, only that they cannot be so easily dismissed.

Risse argues that one important set of non-relational grounds of justice is rights of collective ownership of the Earth's original resources -- resources that "exist independently of human contributions" (p. 108). What is the content of these rights? In the first instance, collective ownership means that humanity as a whole owns the Earth (p. 108). As Risse notes, the idea of collective ownership can be developed in different ways. He calls his own account of this idea -- developed in interesting dialogue with the views of Hugo Grotius – common ownership. Common ownership holds that each individual person has, as co-owner, "an equal opportunity to satisfy basic needs to the extent that this turns on collectively owned resources." (p. 111). Put in terms of Hohfeldian incidents, individual rights deriving from common ownership consist in a privilege to use resources to satisfy basic needs, claims that others not interfere with one's use of resources in satisfying basic needs, and an immunity against the imposition of any institutional arrangements that would interfere with such opportunities. (pp. 110-112, 124).

Let us put to the side arguments that question whether the Earth is indeed collectively owned and consider whether Risse's doctrine of Common Ownership is the most morally plausible interpretation of this idea.[5] One concern with Common Ownership is that the rights it allocates are too minimalistic. That is, while these rights are high priority rights, and thus generally take precedence over competing claims, including private property claims (p. 117), the claim to non-interference is "limited to appropriations necessary to satisfy a person's basic needs" (p. 112). Risse stresses the minimalistic nature of such rights by discussing a fictional scenario to which he returns several times -- that of a United States in which its population is reduced to two people who control access to its territory via sophisticated border surveillance. Even if there are a great many outsiders who wish to gain some access to the plentiful resources within these borders, the two people would do nothing unjust, according to Risse's doctrine of Common Ownership, if they continued to forcibly exclude them, so long as those seeking admittance have an opportunity to meet their basic needs in other ways (p. 125). He claims that these two people act unreasonably, but not unjustly, in so excluding them (p. 132). Those who find it implausible that the two remaining US citizens would be within their rights in forcibly excluding millions of outsiders who are able to meet their basic needs, but not much else, with the resources available to them should consider competing views of the ownership ideal.

Risse recognizes two competing views of collective ownership that would not have such implications, which he calls "Equal Division" and "Joint Ownership," but he argues that neither of them is plausible. He rejects Equal Division, which would demand that each person have an equal initial right to natural resources on the ground that it requires a common metric for valuing sets of resources (pp. 122-24). Risse argues that there is no uniquely most plausible way of assessing the values of resources for human purposes (p. 122). This argument seems too quick. Even if we are unable to develop a precise metric, it seems that there are a great many instances in which judgements about the value of different bundles of resources will be widely shared. Note that Risse's own views on immigration make use of the idea of overuse and underuse of original resources (Ch. 8). Such judgements also presuppose at least a rough metric for the value of such resources, since estimates of a country's "usage rate" of natural resources on its territory require it. I am unsure why a metric that would be adequate for the purpose of assessing the usage rate of resources within a territory could not also serve as a metric for making assessments of relative shares, though assessments of both kinds will be admittedly rough.

What of Joint Ownership? Risse rejects an interpretation of this doctrine that would require unanimous (actual) consent by all owners any time anyone wanted to use collective property. His principal objection is that such a doctrine "violates autonomy by expecting each person to get everyone's consent before she can satisfy her basic needs" (p. 121). However, it would seem that there are other ways of developing the idea of joint ownership that would not have these counterintuitive implications. One could adopt a hybrid view, for example, according to which people have rights to appropriate in order to satisfy their basic needs without consent, but would need consent were they (individually or in coordination with others) to appropriate more (or much more) than would be required to do so. Or one could incorporate a collective ownership analogue to the Lockean Proviso (itself a constraint on appropriation of un-owned resources), whereby consent would be required for appropriation that did not leave "enough and as good" for others. These alternative interpretations of joint ownership would ensure that people's rights of basic appropriation were secure, but protect people from others' appropriation of vast amounts of resources without their consent.

It is also important to note that there is nothing in the idea of joint ownership that implies that a unanimity rule be employed in decisions regarding common property. Cooperative apartment buildings, for example, seem to capture well the idea of joint ownership, and governance rules concerning the management of such properties vary quite significantly across and within jurisdictions. Indeed, different kinds of agreement are typically needed for different kinds of decisions concerning use and change of such properties. Cooperatives typically elect, through majoritarian and suprermajoritarian procedures, boards that are accountable in various ways to joint owners, but which are empowered to make decisions on their behalf without obtaining unanimous consent.

Risse also considers an alternative version of Joint Ownership, in which he envisions an analogue to Rawls's original position wherein "all parties are joint owners and seek to agree on principles under which all may acquire without unanimity in particular acts" (p. 121). He argues that this possibility is not a real alternative to his own view, since Common Ownership "would then emerge from such deliberation" (p. 121). I am unsure how Risse reaches this conclusion. In such an original position, it would seem prudent for joint owners to adopt principles that would not only ensure that they could meet their basic needs, but which would protect them against scenarios in which some appropriate vast amounts of resources leaving others with little to try to appropriate. Risse defines natural rights as those that every reasonable person should be able to accept, and writes that reasonable persons can reject stronger conceptions of collective ownership (p. 122). He also states clearly that he wishes his arguments in support of collective ownership rights to rely on "maximally uncontroversial claims" (p. 114). But the claim that collective ownership rights are restricted to rights to opportunities to meet basic needs is very controversial. Reasonable persons can reject the idea that conceptions of collective ownership are as weak as Common Ownership stipulates them to be (even if they cannot reasonably reject conceptions of collective ownership rights that are weaker still.) We need further explanation of why such parties feel compelled to adopt rules of appropriation that are consistent with many people having only very minimal opportunities and which could give rise to radically different levels of advantage.[6]

While I have expressed some reservations about various strands of Risse's arguments, it bears repeating that this is an important book with which all serious students of global justice should engage.


Thanks to Luara Ferracioli, Matthew Lindauer, Leif Wenar and David Wiens for suggestions on an earlier draft of this review.

[1] Statists, as Risse defines them, are monistic relationists about justice, since they treat ground 1 only as relevant to justice. So too are globalists on his definition, since they treat ground 4 only as relevant to justice.

[2] Malcolm Bull, "Help Yourself", Review of On Global Justice by Mathias Risse, London Review of Books 35, 4, pp. 15-17.

[3] Thomas Pogge, Realizing Rawls, Cornell University Press (1989), pp. 28-36, 73-81; Samuel Freeman Rawls, Routledge (2007), pp. 98-105. For further discussion of the concept of redistribution and the role it plays in discussions of distributive justice, see Christian Barry "Redistribution", The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Spring 2014 Edition), Edward N. Zalta (ed.).

[4] Liam Murphy and Thomas Nagel, The Myth of Ownership, Oxford University Press (2002) at pp. 32-33, 174-75).

[5] I should point out that while Risse provides arguments against the doctrine that the Earth is un-owned (No Ownership) without provisos (pp. 116-18), he does not engage with versions of No Ownership that incorporate provisos. It is unclear why he considers Common Ownership to be superior to No Ownership with provisos that would limit appropriation to allow others an opportunity to meet their basic needs.

[6] To some extent, his arguments here rely on is views regarding the normative peculiarity of the state, which I won't discuss further here.