On Hegel: The Sway of the Negative

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Karin de Boer, On Hegel: The Sway of the Negative, Palgrave, 2010, 266pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780230247543.

Reviewed by George di Giovanni, McGill University


Though not large in size (200 pages in normal format discounting end-notes and general apparatus), this book defends a complex thesis that requires it to range far and wide over the whole Hegelian corpus. The title, indefinite as it is ("On Hegel"), and the aphorism of the subtitle ("The Sway of the Negative"), already signals the broadness of the book's reach and the complexity of the thesis underpinning it. These traits make the book difficult to report on, but one can try none the less. The book is motivated by a critique of modernity that involves a critique of Hegel inasmuch as the latter's dialectical optimism is a hallmark of modernity. The critique is inspired by such figures as "Kierkegaard, Marx, Adorno, Heidegger, and Derrida," (5) at least to the extent that, like them, the author questions Hegel's principle of "absolute negativity." However, unlike these mentors, who failed to do justice to the strength of Hegel's thought, the author intends to capitalize on this strength by relying on a suggestion, which she finds in Hegel's early Essay on Natural Law (1803), that would limit the negative to its more tragic aspects. Hegel's is only a suggestion. As the author clearly recognizes, in the same essay Hegel also advances the more speculative idea of "absolute negativity" to which he is driven because of systematic requirements (26-27). None the less, it is on this more limited suggestion of a "tragic negative," and the entanglements to which it gives rise in concreto, that the author pins her hopes for an understanding of the dynamics of the contemporary world. As she says, "Nothing prevents us from … converting this very entanglement into a basic philosophical principle" (28).

Accordingly, the book is a reflection on all aspects of Hegel's system that exploits, while at the same time criticizing and limiting, Hegel's leading idea of the "negative." The book unfolds in ten chapters -- the shortest 7 pages, the longest 22 -- that follow on the whole the sequence of the Encyclopedia. It is Logic, however, and the conceptual problems that it poses, that control the book's development from beginning to end. For the author, contrary to what she takes to be the tendency of post-analytical Anglophone literature on Hegel to privilege the Phenomenology (the same, I add, could be said of the post-war French scene) believes (rightly so, in my opinion) that the capital work of Hegel, the one that holds his whole system together, is precisely the Logic. Chapter 1 presents what the author believes to be "Hegel's early account of tragedy" (7). Chapters 3 to 4 are a study of the Logic, while Chapters 5 to 8 relate the author's interpretation of the Logic to the rest of the System ("Circularity," "Nature," "Language," "Teleology"). In Chapter 9, the author finally turns to History. "Drawing on the perspective developed in the preceding chapters," the aim here is "to bring out the tragic nature of conflicts such as those between universality and particularity, freedom and power, the individual and the community, or progress and tradition" (8).

What is, then, this "tragic negative"? I abstract, by necessity, from the hermeneutic details of the author's argument. The main point is that, as Greek culture came to reflect upon its transition, at some point in the past, from an archaic form of family based society, such as is represented in myth by the figure of Antigone, to one based on law, as figured in myth by Creon, it expressed this transition in tragic terms. Tragedy arose because the two terms involved -- figuratively speaking, Creon and Antigone -- both embodied a principle of social arrangement which, in principle, was self-justifying. Each, therefore, albeit in contrary forms, presumed to represent society in toto. But, precisely for this reason, each irresistibly tended to absorb the other in order to overcome its own finitude, while at the same time resisting the other's attempt to absorb it. "Thus, tragic negativity refers to the radically finite effort of contrary moments to annul their entanglement and to posit themselves as the unique principle of both" (179). This coincidence of "tendency to absorb" and counteracting "resistance to absorption" is what, in the emblematic case of Creon and Antigone, made for what the author calls a "tragic entanglement." The entanglement was one of finite beings who, by claiming universality for their finitude, paradoxically made the finitude in fact resistant precisely as finitude. The entanglement, therefore, was in principle incapable of resolution and, as such, predictably led to tragic fate (cf. 176-177).

According to the author -- if I understand her correctly -- it is this finitude, this resistance to being taken up into something higher, that must be elevated to the level of principle if one wants to understand the irreducible recurrence of conflict in history. Hegel, for his part, proceeded in the opposite direction. He transformed "tragic entanglement" into "dialectical interplay" by privileging one of the two terms of the original contrariety -- in our case, Creon. In effect, he rendered the relation between the terms asymmetrical, thereby enabling the privileged term (Creon) to absorb the other (Antigone) and, by the same token, preparing the way for the absorption of both into a higher totality (already pre-figured by Creon) in which their difference was cancelled. (cf. 102, inter alia) This move was possible, however, only because Hegel's dialectic proceeds, so to speak, from top down. At each given opposition of terms it already presupposes a higher conceptual configuration out of which they have been generated and into which, therefore, they ineluctably return. This is part and parcel of Hegel's well known circular method. Any resistance on the part of a determinate term to this return can only be apparent, for, in point of fact, the resistance is only a play of a given (abstract) conceptual configuration with itself. The author, for her part, undertakes to reform Hegel by capitalizing (in the spirit of Adorno, one can surmise) on the presumed irreducibility of precisely this resistance -- a resistance that must be understood historically in the first place.

The author thus proceeds to reflect on all aspects of Hegel's system. The general aim seems to be to bring out the moment of "tragic negativity," that is, the reciprocity of contrary determinations that resists the asymmetrical privileging of one over the other and is at work at all levels of Hegel's system, even though Hegel's use of negativity tends to obscure it. "Considered in this way," i.e., as the author has just done,

the contrary determinations of a particular concept must both give up their purported comprehensiveness, and both enact a double negation [i.e., one directed to itself no less than to the other] to achieve their synthesis. By focusing on this reciprocity, the method employed in the Logic, I would suggest, turns out to be essentially modeled on Hegel's earlier insight into tragic conflicts… . Once this reciprocity is brought out, it also becomes possible to ask whether contrary determinations, both containing their contrary, establish their opposition by negating their initial unity [in this way, I take it, resisting absorption] or rather their mutual entanglement [i.e., allowing absorption]… . Hegel's own reflection on his method begins by considering the moment at which a concept has already established itself as an abstract identity, but he does not indicate whence this abstraction begins (82-83).

All this is indeed done with great erudition and a wealth of insights. There is room, however, for entertaining serious reservations about the author's main thesis. Because of the complexity of this thesis, it is difficult not to state objections dogmatically. One can try to pinpoint the main issue by taking as starting point this statement of the author: "The Logic hardly ever addresses the question as to the application of pure concepts" (48). As a matter of fact, the Logic never addresses such a question, and it would be surprising if it did, because the question would imply that, just like Kant's categories, Hegel's would need an extraneous historical content on which they depend for their validity as categories. But this would make them conceptual expressions just as subjective as Kant's. Hegel famously did not want any of this. His Logic is self-contained, complete with its own content. Just like the syntax of a language which reflectively expresses the language's basic structure -- and in this sense, therefore, contains it in toto, yet does not itself say anything that the language says directly (its object is the language itself) -- so Hegel's Logic is an extended reflection on the moves that discourse in general must make in order to retain its internal coherence as discourse. The universe of which it is the blueprint is one of meaning. Motivating discourse is reason's own interest at expressing itself as reason. This is an interest, however, which is not satisfied so far as content goes, for the attempt at satisfaction invariably runs into a particular determination that calls in turn for another which is equally particular. Discourse is always discourse about something particular, and, as such, any instance of it necessarily requires contextualization. This, of course, Hegel had learned from Fichte and, to a lesser extent, from Kant.

The difference is that, for Hegel, there is indeed satisfaction for reason, but not in an actual discourse that would de facto never be complete but for which one must nonetheless postulate an end in an ideal future ("ideal" in the sense of merely imaginatively construed). Nor would satisfaction be attained by consummating the discourse in an intuition that would necessarily eschew consciousness because it would annul the distance between subject and object that consciousness requires. Rather, completion and consequent satisfaction is achieved in reason's explicit (hence the need of a Logic) comprehension of itself as constantly generating, because of its reflection, the extra intelligible space that makes determination possible in the first place, and, consequently, also generating the orderly progression of discourse. This is the progression by which discourse constantly returns upon itself, re-states its originating theme in ever more concrete terms, redirects it in ever different directions yet always maintains unity of intent. Completion is achieved in the concept of discourse as such, or, in other words, in the concept of the concept, the Idea. The only content of the Idea is "method." Like a syntax, the Logic contains the whole of discourse by dictating its norms without ever pre-determining its actual content.

On this reading, however, the author's distinction between "absolute" and "tragic" negativity, and, for that matter, her question, "whence this [conceptual] abstraction begins?" become moot. Abstraction begins in reason's reflectivity, and the issue at stake is not one of resistance to abstraction but, on the contrary, of reason's generating the possibility of it. Reconciliation is indeed possible for Hegel, but it can only be speculative -- that is, it consists in self-comprehension. In the Introduction, the author says that one of her aims is to demonstrate that "Hegel's view as to how the unity of thought and the object of thought can be achieved is much more in agreement with Kant's conception of transcendental philosophy than his formulations [would otherwise] suggest" (39-40). This is a commendable aim. I share it. But one can wonder whether, in the spirit of Adorno, the author has reformed Hegel by in fact bringing his Logic back to Kant's.

The book concludes with a wide-ranging discussion, in the spirit of a reformed Hegel, on "World History," "Economy," "Politics," and "Intercultural Conflicts." This is the least satisfactory chapter, not indeed because one need disagree with its many comments, but because it is difficult either to agree or disagree with any. They are generalizations that tend to lapse into editorial script: an application to historical material of supposed Hegelian conceptual schemas which, on Hegel's own logical terms, would have to count as abstract. Some of the comments, moreover, would hardly resonate in countries where parliamentary democracy is the rule, where majority is rare at the popular level and is often lacking even in parliament, but where good governance is supposed to be by consensus, not by majority. And what about societies that are based on different peoples treasuring their differences, yet coming together for a common political purpose? How would they fit into the author's scheme of "tragic negativity"? Spirit is too rich, too creative, to be captured by any single formula. It is instructive that the work where Hegel tries to do precisely that, his lectures on the philosophy of history, is the one which is the most vulnerable to both historical and conceptual objections.

I also cannot abstain from two more comments. I miss, in the otherwise very extensive Bibliography, mention of H. S. Harris's masterful two volume commentary on the Phenomenology of Spirit or, for that matter, of his two books on Hegel's early development preceding it. This lacuna is regrettable. Also, the author repeatedly refers to Hegel's "spurious infinite." One can hardly blame her for that, since the expression has long been in use in Anglophone literature to translate Hegel's "das schlechte Unendliche." The fact remains, however, that the expression is not just an inaccurate translation of the original German but is plainly wrong. The right translation is "bad infinite" (or, perhaps even better, "poor infinite"). "Bad infinite" is to "spurious infinite" what "bad (or poor) medicine" is to "quackery." "Quackery" is no medicine at all; it is pseudo medicine. In contrast, there can be medicine which is badly or poorly practiced yet still falls within the general norms of the profession. This is the case of Hegel's "schlechte Unendlichkeit." It might be "bad" or "poor" in the sense of being still undeveloped as concept; yet it remains an "infinite."

It is well and good to interpret Hegel, and equally so to criticize him in order to develop an independent position. But to do the two at once, all in 200 pages, makes great demands on the reader. The question arises at the end, exactly who is this book for? Certainly not for neophytes, for it presupposes acquaintance -- and even more than just first acquaintance -- with the whole Hegelian corpus; and not for experts, for too much is attempted much too briefly to engage anyone with already formed opinions. This being said, there is much in the book to stimulate serious reflection. Whether one ultimately agrees or disagrees with it, the book is indeed well worth reading.