On Heretics, Books 1-5 and Against John, Chapters 5-16

William of Ockham

John Kilcullen and John Scott (trans. and introd.), William of Ockham, On Heretics, Books 1–5 and Against John, Chapters 5–16, Oxford University Press, 2023, Auctores Britannici Medii Aevi 43, 497pp., $150.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780197267592.

Reviewed by Monica Brinzei, IRHT–CNRS, Paris


This volume, number 43 of the collection Auctores Britannici Medii Aevi, is the sixth of the project editing the Dialogus of William of Ockham, initiated by John Kilcullen and John Scott more than 30 years ago at the invitation of David Luscombe. Volumes 20 (published in 2011: Dialogus: Part 2. Part 3, Tract 1, eds. John Kilcullen, John Scott, Jan Ballweg, and Volker Leppin), 33 (2019: Dialogus: Part 3, Tract 2, eds. Semih Heinen and Karl Ubl), 35 (2020: Dialogus: Part 1, Books 1–5, eds. John Kilcullen and John Scott), 41 (2023: Dialogus: Part 1, Book 6, ed. George Knysh), and 42 (2023: Dialogus: Part 1, Book 7, ed. George Knysh) give access to the critical edition of William of Ockham’s treatise. The present volume offers an English translation of the Latin text published in volume 35, i.e., books 1–5 of Part 1, On Heretics, as well as the briefer chapters 5–16 from the treatise Against John, edited by H.S. Offler and published in volume III of Ockham’s Opera Politica in 1956.

The manuscript Besançon, Bibliothèque Municipale, 198 transmits a copy of the Cistercian James of Eltville’s questions on the Sentences of Peter Lombard, based on lectures given in Paris in 1369–70. The codex, dated 1399, is codicologically surprising in that the medieval front pastedown consists of a bifolio from Ockham’s questions 5 and 6 on the Prologue of the Sentences, about 57 pages of his epic discussion of intuitive and abstractive cognition in the modern edition. Thus Ockham’s own questions on the Sentences, one of the most studied texts of medieval philosophy, although surviving in just a handful of manuscripts, was recycled as binding material less than a century after its composition. In contrast, at the end of the fourteenth century the Venerable Inceptor’s Dialogus was a bestseller, now preserved in around 50 medieval codices and two incunabula (Paris 1476 and Lyon 1494), in addition to a later printing (Frankfurt 1614). Interest in the Dialogus appears in the works of scholastics in Paris from at least the 1360s: James of Eltville quoted from the Dialogus extensively in his Sentences questions, Étienne Gaudet produced a sort of summary of the work in order to attack the political views of Marsilius of Padua, and Pierre d’Ailly crafted an abbreviation of Ockham’s text as a guide to the reader. This despite the fact that the treatise was penned as part of a campaign launched by the rebel Minorite against Pope John XXII and his successors Benedict XII and Clement VI, whom he labelled heretics for their ideas concerning the beatific vision and their attitude toward Franciscan poverty.

This volume is divided into five units. A long introduction (1–58) familiarizes the reader with Ockham’s life, his political writings, and his vision of the Church, with a conclusion on what the editors call Ockham’s liberalism (51–58). The second unit is the translation of the first 5 books of On Heretics (Part 1) of the Dialogus, in which Ockham presents his conception of heresy. He defines heresy as any “false doctrine contrary to orthodox faith” (114) and a heretic as anyone who refuses to submit to correction or to retract his errors against Catholic truth. The third part of the volume (421–471) is a selection of chapters (5–12) from Contra Johannem where Ockham investigates the conditions that identify someone as a heretic and the procedure for judging and convicting that person of heresy. Certain ideas already developed in Book 2 of On Heretics overlap with some discussion in Against John. The volume ends with a useful bibliography on the topic (473–484) and a series of handy indices (485–497): “General Index,” “People Index,” “Bible Index,” “Civil Law Index,” and “Canon Law Index.”

The Dialogus is composed as a fictional conversation between a master and a disciple. In the Prologue, Ockham, who will play the master, complains that he is driven by the constant nagging of his interlocutor, who will play the student, to compose a work of this form in order to explain to him the mechanism of authority, and, more precisely, how ecclesiological and secular power lead to a reflection on the limits of the power of the emperor and of the pope. The argumentative framework is very consistent, with a wide range of questions that inspire the reader to ponder not only authority, but also freedom of thought and freedom of expression. At the heart of the discussion is the fact that theologians can identify heresy but do not have the authority to impose punishment on their superiors, in this case the pope. Ockham accepts this limitation on the action of the theologians, for when they detect heresy or error “they do not know how to compose or prepare the writs of accusation, reply, appeal, and the like, but must have recourse to canonists” (77). It appears that Ockham’s intent is to stress the theologians’ freedom to identify and consider error and heresy while at the same time recognising their inability to decide on the punishment. This is the role of canon law, for while theologians judge in an epistemological realm, the canonists determine the legal sentence.

In a number of passages, Ockham goes off on fascinating tangents, such as one on authorial auctoritas. At one point the disciple warns his master never to put his name on the text, because it would prejudice the reader who knows his views or reputation. Anonymity is a hermeneutic tool that ensures neutrality, because anonymous positions will be judged for their doctrinal content and not for the name of the person signing the text. In addition, the disciple also maintains that it is necessary to cite other authors by their initials alone, since what counts is the battle of ideas and not personal bias and animosity between authors who know each other.

In Book 3, chapter 9 (198–201), Ockham offers some captivating thoughts on the practice of protestationes, which were public oaths that, most notably, bachelors of theology took in front of the university at the start of their lectures on the Sentences, by which they swore publicly not to offend and/or to criticise on purpose the Roman Church, the Catholic faith, the university, or its members (professors or fellow bachelors). Such protestationes could provide a sort of protection from condemnation and later played a crucial role in the cases of John Wycliffe and Jan Hus. Ockham seems to be quite aware of this use and its efficiency, as evidenced by his claim that “in these times (when very many people try out of hatred, rancour, envy and malice to defame those who are better and wiser than themselves by accusing them of heresy) many teachers, preachers and writers make such protestations to show before everyone that they are not pertinacious” (199).

It is rather difficult to categorise the Dialogus as exclusively a political work, since it can also be appropriately characterised as a polemical text and as a philosophical treatise, as the translators of this volume (the editors of the Latin text) recognize. Indeed, in order to explain the mechanism of heresy, Ockham investigates what the Catholic truth is, identifying five kinds of truth (113) that those who profess the Catholic faith should never abandon (the truth of the Bible, the truth of the stories of the Apostles and their followers, the truth in chronicles and histories of the faithful, the truth that can be inferred from the first three, and the truth of what has been revealed to others and is recognized by the Church). Once the nature of Catholic truth is defined, Ockham turns to an analysis of faith (explicit and implicit), which then aids in delineating implicit and explicit heresy. Technically speaking, Ockham’s definition of heresy is not wholly original, for it is rooted in Augustine’s and even in Thomas Aquinas’s conceptions. Ockham’s innovative contribution is his reflection on being stubborn in persisting to hold something that should be put aside (see book 4). Pertinacity can be mental or external, measured by the intensity with which one persists in cultivating an error and neglecting occasions to retract unorthodox tenets. Ockham’s interesting position on pertinacity, explored in Book 4 (211–284), can be understood as a continuation of Augustine’s reflections on stubbornness, especially when applied to the Jews, who persisted in misinterpreting the Bible. Ockham identifies different ways of being pertinacious: (1) persisting in holding that the Catholic faith is not true; (2) believing in the truth of the Catholic faith but at the same time embracing errors that contradict that truth faith; (3) endorsing errors and passing over occasions to relinquish a mistaken opinion. Ignorance is discussed as part of mental stubbornness, because someone can continue to hold views that contradict the faith without knowing that she is committing an error. Ockham’s solution is to stress that only implicit faith, the will to believe as the Church believes even if one does not know what the Church believes, can prevent the persistent stubbornness that leads to heresy. To avoid heresy caused by being pernicious, one should be open to correcting one’s assessments, retracting one’s incorrect views, and demonstrating the explicit intention of being corrected.

The complete edition of the Dialogus provided scholars with access to a text that, while written in the first half of the fourteenth century in the context of a revolt against the popes of the day, grew popular as a vade mecum for theologians seeking to understand and to solve the crisis of the Great Schism in the second half of the century. The translation is accessible and clear despite the technical complexity of Ockham’s prose. This volume of English translations of part of the Dialogus and of some chapters Against John offers a wider audience a glimpse of a leading medieval philosopher’s analysis of authority, truth, error, ignorance, pertinacity, and freedom of thought.


Iacobi de Altavilla. 2024. Lectura in libros Sententiarum: Principium. Questiones 1–6 (Prologus et QQ.1–4 Libri Primi), Tomus I, ed. et cura M. Brinzei, C. Schabel (Corpus Christianorum Continuatio Mediaevalis, 312), Turnhout: Brepols.

Kaluza, Zenon. 2002. “Le brouillon de trois questions d’Etienne Gaudet sur le Grand Schisme.” Revirescunt chartae, codices, documenta, textus. Miscellanea in honorem fr. Caesaris Cenci OFM, cura a A. Cacciotti, P. Stella, Roma vol. 2, 1115–1146.

Maga, Mihai. (forthcoming 2024). “Withstanding a Radical Event: Etienne Gaudet’s Note Against Marsilius of Padua.” in Radical Thinking in the Middle Ages. Acts of the XV International Congress of the SIEPM, Paris, 21–26 August 2022, ed. M. Brinzei, I. Caiazzo, Ch. Grellard, A. Robert (Rencontre de Philosophie Médiévale) Turnhout: Brepols.