On Human Persons

Placeholder book cover

Petrus, Klaus (ed.), On Human Persons, Ontos, 2003, 214pp, ? 26,00 (pbk), ISBN 3937202315.

Reviewed by Klaus Puhl, University of Graz


This volume contains a short preface and eleven essays about the ontology of persons and the question of personal identity. They are written in the analytic tradition, that is, in the framework, marked on the one end by the work of John Locke and on the other by Derek Parfit. Locke notoriously based what makes up a person on body-independent criteria such as self-consciousness or memory. Parfit influentially claimed in Reasons and Persons that what matters to us is not personal identity but psychological continuity. The problem of personal identity over time is taken up by Kevin J. Corcoran in his “Biology or Psychology? Human Persons and Personal Identity”. Most of the papers, however, are concerned with the metaphysics or ontology of persons, that is, the question of what it is that makes us the persons we are. In these papers the main bogeyman seems to be Animalism, which is only defended by Eric T. Olson’s contribution, written in German, “Warum wir Tiere sind” (“Why we are animals”). Lynne Rudder Baker in “The Difference that Self-Consciousness Makes”, Kevin J. Corcoran, Brian Garrett (“Some Thoughts on Animalism”), Paul Snowdon (“Some Objections to Animalism”) Michael B. Burke (“Is My Head a Person”), Klaus Petrus (“Human Persons: Some Conceptual Remarks”) and Käthe Trettin in “Persons and Other Trope Complexes” more or less explicitly argue against Animalism and for a combination of a psychological and a bodily/physical conception of persons. Daniel Cohnitz - “Personal Identity and the Methodology of Imaginary Cases” looks at the flourishing debate within analytic philosophy, started by Parfit and his critics, about the usefulness of thought-experiments for clarifying our intuitions about personhood and personal identity. Daniel von Wachter’s “Free Agents as Cause” discusses the link between being a person and acting freely, while Thomas Spitzley in his “Identität und Orientierung” (“Identity and Orientation”) critically develops Charles Taylor’s conception of personal identity as essentially linked to moral orientation.

Animalism, as put forward by Olson, claims that each of us is essentially numerically identical with a human animal and that psychology is irrelevant to personal identity. As psychological persistence is not necessary for the persistence of a human animal – there is, for instance, no psychological continuity between me and when I was an embryo or a baby -, and, according to a thought-experiment by Olson, also not sufficient, the persistence of persons lies in the persistence of their bodies. As an antidote to the downgrading by much of the philosophical tradition, including analytic philosophy, of the body for what it means to be a person or a subject, animalism has a point. Animalism takes the bodily nature of personhood to the extremes by claiming the irrelevance of psychological continuity for personal identity. Thus, Animalism is at odds not only with any form of mind-body dualism, a doctrine nobody in the present volume defends anyway, but also with the Lockean tradition of looking for a psychological criterion for personhood, or a combination of the psychological with the bodily criterion, such as the “Constitution View” put forward by Lynne Rudder Baker, according to which persons are constituted by their bodies, but not identical with them. Constitution is a relation weaker than identity and stronger than separation, thus forming an inseparable unity of different things. In fact, the constitutional relation between persons and their bodies “is exactly the same as the relation of a statue and the pieces of marble that makes it up” (p. 27, my italics), just as some statues are constituted by pieces of marble without being identical with these pieces. What prevents the identification of a person with the body is, for Baker, the additional capacity of self-consciousness, underlined by the first-person-perspective, that defines a person and which cannot be reduced to the body which constitutes her or him. Self-consciousness corresponds to the statue as piece of art. However, I don’t see how the relation between a person and her body and between a statue and its “body” can be the same, as Baker claims. On everybody’s intuitions a statue cannot exist without the stuff it is made from. But the same claim about persons wouldn’t meet the intuitions of somebody claiming the possible independence of persons from their bodies (the Lockean). And an Animalist wouldn’t accept the identification of (the logic of) persons with (the logic of) statues either, as statues cannot just be identified with the material they are made of. Hence, the Constitutional View begs the question against both positions, as long as it identifies the relation between persons and their bodies with the one holding between statues and their material. Instead of defending this identification directly, Baker stresses against Animalism the irreducible nature of self-consciousness and its being required for being the persons we are. As I see it, however, Animalism does not deny the uniqueness of self-consciousness, but that our continued existence as persons is constituted by the continued existence of our self-consciousness.

Käthe Trettin in her contribution claims that the concept of a person is best understood not in terms of a substance-attribute ontology but in an ontological framework which is based on tropes, that is, particular properties. She then argues that “person” is a normative and not an ontological concept based on David Wiggins’ Human Being Principle, according to which “person” and “human being” assign the same principle of individuation without having the same sense or even the same extension. Michael B. Burke claims to be faithful to “the Aristotelian metaphysics implicit in our ordinary ways of thinking” (p. 107) when answering the title-question of his paper: Is my head a person? He canvasses the positions defended by Olson, Merricks, Geach, Lewis and Carter and tries to show that the head and “other brain-containing parts of whole-bodied human persons or thinkers” are not themselves persons or thinkers. Generally speaking, this problem only arises in ontological accounts of the person, according to which persons are thing-like entities (usually also with psychological properties) or in fiction, specifically in science fiction. For the vast majority of philosophers our being the self and person we are, in contrast say to human beings, cannot be separated from how we conceptualize and experience ourselves as persons, that is, from an epistemological account. Quite a few philosophers like Michel Foucault or Judith Butler even argue that the concept of the human body has to be historicized, that is, they claim that our bodies are not ontologically given, but structured by forms of knowledge and practices (“technologies of the self”) directed at them. Nevertheless, in the present book, such views are not even considered, as Animalism and its critiques alike take for granted that our material side, the bodies or human beings (animals) we are, make up an unproblematic, gender-neutral and universal category, so that the main question is if we are different from or the same as our bodies.

Kevin J. Corcoran defends a version of the Constitution View: human persons exist as physical and psychological entities in the sense that bodily and psychological continuity are not only necessary but jointly sufficient for the persistence of persons. However, in an interesting move, he distances himself from Baker’s claim that the same human person could be constituted by different bodies at different times, by pointing out that Baker here relies on ontological assumptions which are independent from her Constitution View. Klaus Petrus looks at our concept of human beings and of being a person, contrasting his approach with the ontological question of what persons and human beings are. Again, such an apparently clear distinction between conceptual and metaphysical or ontological questions might pose more problems especially in the case of persons. Petrus argues convincingly that we have a unified concept of ourselves as human persons, that is, as human beings that are inseparably connected to being persons, and vice versa. This allows Petrus for instance to reject imaginary cases of brains or whole persons switching bodies, as in these cases we are talking about mere human beings or mere persons, and not the unified concept of the person.

Already Locke but especially Parfit rely on bizarre thought-experiments and puzzle cases, – body-switching minds, split-brains, fission, tele-transportation, etc. – and on appeals to intuitions and to conceivability. Since then a little industry of producing and refining contra-factual thought-experiments and imaginary cases has developed, not only for illustrating accounts of person and personal identity but as arguments for them. Thus it does not come as a surprise that the reader finds a fair share of them also in the present book, which sometimes makes for a tiresome read. The heavy reliance on imaginary cases is quite unique for analytic philosophy and not, as it is several times claimed in the book (e. g. pp. 145, 146, 151), common in philosophy (of the person) in general.

This is probably due to Locke’s reification of self-consciousness which in some form or the other still structures much of the discussion of the concept of a person within analytic philosophy, even when modified or contradicted. By turning self-consciousness into something that is independent of bodies, souls or mental substances and that makes up the identity of a person, Locke made the possibility or conceivability of a consciousness and hence a person “jumping” into different bodies, etc. into a criterion for his theory. There have emerged quite a few books and papers on the usefulness and reliability of counterfactual cases for identifying and re-identifying persons. Opponents of the method of counterfactual thought-experiments usually point out that the relevant imaginary cases are question-begging insofar as their description presupposes the correctness of the position defended, or that the cases are under-described so that the same cases, described in different ways, can lead to wholly different intuitive conclusions.

In the present volume this is nicely illustrated by the imaginary brain-transplant and body-switching cases, a modern version of Locke’s prince waking up in the body of a cobbler, where my brain is transplanted into the brainless skull of another person, such that the resulting person is psychologically continuous with me. (I suppose this would also have to include the continuity of my relevant bodily characteristics like mimic, posture, sound of voice, etc. which only philosophers tend to separate from the psychological.) For Brian Garrett, who, if somewhat hesitatingly, opposes Animalism, “our reactions to these thought experiments suggest … that …a continuing line of … psychological continuity is sufficient for personal identity” (p. 44). However, Olson reacts differently by stressing the fictional character of brain-transplantations and by reaffirming his animalistic position: faced with those imaginary cases we have to say that there is no personal identity preserved, because I (the person whose brain was transplanted, but whose body was destroyed) survive just and only in case my animal functions continue after the switch. Daniel Cohnitz revisits the debate about the role of thought-experiments and argues that even if contra-factual cases may not help to solve metaphysical questions they might inform us about “what really is of importance to us”, for instance by helping us to find out what we would say in contra-factual cases.

The last two essays in the book discuss the possibility of agent causation (Daniel von Wachter) and the relation between personhood and authenticity (Thomas Spitzley). Von Wachter starts his paper with what he calls the dilemma of free will according to which there is no freedom because “if actions are caused deterministically, then they are not free, and if they are not caused deterministically then they are not free either because then they happen by chance and are not up to the agent.” This dilemma presupposes a naturalistic analysis of actions. In order to solve the dilemma, von Wachter postulates so-called “choice events” “which have no preceding cause and whose occurrence is due to an agent” (p. 185). A free agent “is somebody who can cause things by doing something for a reason and with an intention”. Having reasons and intentions is not again caused. Under the heading “Is agent causation mysterious?” van Wachter’s makes it clear that his free agents would have to be entities “that have the power to let certain things pop up (so that they have no preceding cause)” (p. 192) By “free agents” he can’t mean physio-psychological persons or he wouldn’t continue “The question is whether there are such entities, but there is nothing in the nature of the causal processes we know … that speaks against the existence of such entities.” Thus, von Wachter solves the dilemma of the free will, which he has presented as a naturalistic dilemma, in a super-naturalistic way, without making this clear, by introducing an entity that acts spontaneously and can intervene in causal processes and cannot be identical with a bodily person. Such an entity is traditionally called a soul, but in the paper it is presented as a new solution to the problem of the free will. (Reading some of the contributions one might get the impression that scholastic or pre-Kantian positions are happily re-interpreted within the analytic paradigm.)

Thomas Spitzley’s contribution is the only one in the present book which discusses the person in a political-moral context, that is in the context of Charles Taylor’s conception of personal identity as essentially linked to moral orientation. Spitzley points out that it is not only moral orientation which constitutes our selves but also projects, attitudes, opinions, preferences, aversions, etc. Spitzley’s paper is also the only one in the book which historicizes the self by following Taylor in his account of the modern self as structured by the search for authenticity, that is, the search for self-realization, self-discovery or being true to oneself. Spitzley discusses this project in the political context of liberalism and communitarianism and argues that for Taylor, because of his communitarianism, being true to oneself particularly means being true to the requirements of society. For readers who work in the tradition of analytic philosophy and the metaphysics of the person, or are interested in it, the present book makes for an interesting and stimulating read. However, what one doesn’t find discussed in the volume, are other aspects and questions surrounding the concepts of self and persons, such as models which do not separate the question of personal identity and the self from those (historical and contingent) forms of knowledge and practices which are directed at ourselves.1


1. I wish to thank Peter Kügler for valuable comments.