On Human Rights

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James Griffin, On Human Rights, Oxford University Press, 2008, 339pp., $50.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199238781.

Reviewed by William J. Talbott, University of Washington


James Griffin's new book is a singular contribution to the philosophy of human rights. In it he defends his own well-thought-out account with great subtlety and ingenuity, but the exposition of his account and the discussion of the important issues are so nicely structured and so clear and well-informed that the book could easily be used as a text in an undergraduate course.

Griffin takes human rights to be moral rights that we have in virtue of being human (p. 2). He traces the concept of a human right back to the religious idea of a natural right. As Griffin reconstructs the development, in the 17th and 18th centuries, the concept was detached from its religious underpinnings, with the result that there was nothing left to give the concept determinate sense (pp. 13-15). So today we have a plethora of documents containing lists of human rights. What is the rationale for the items on these lists? The usual formula is respect for human dignity. Griffin objects to this rationale on the grounds, not that it is mistaken, but that it is largely empty (p. 5). His goal is to articulate a rationale with determinate content that best fits our ethical judgments.

Griffin grounds his theory of human rights in two ideas: personhood (pp. 33-37), or more precisely, normative agency (p. 45), and practicalities (pp. 37-39). Normative agency is "our capacity to choose and to pursue our conception of a worthwhile life" (p. 45). Practical considerations come into play in determining where to draw the lines that define what the various rights protect. "To be effective, the line has to be clear and so not take too many complicated bends; given our proneness to stretch a point, we should probably have to leave a generous safety margin" (p. 37). So human rights are the rights necessary for normative agency, understood to be drawn in ways that satisfactorily address the various practical considerations.

Griffin believes that when we think of human rights as what is necessary for normative agency, we find that there are three broad categories of human rights: autonomy rights, liberty rights, and welfare rights (where the liberty and welfare rights are limited to those that are necessary for normative agency). I say more about these three categories shortly.

Griffin could hardly claim that grounding his account of human rights in agency is innovative, so he takes some pains to distinguish his account from others that might also be thought of as agency-based. The original agency-based account is that of Kant [1797]; a more recent account of the same kind is that of Gewirth (1978). Griffin distinguishes himself from both Kant and Gewirth in several ways. One difference is in methodology. Kant’s and Gewirth's methodologies are top-down, from basic principles to human rights. But Griffin's methodology is bottom-up. One problem with top-down approaches is that they depend on being able to start from shared fundamental moral principles, and it is hard to find any (p. 37). The bottom-up approach avoids the need for shared fundamental moral principles. For Griffin, the goal is not to derive a theory of human rights from anything more fundamental, but to come up with a proposal that can be compared with competing proposals to find "a theory of human rights that fits into the best ethics overall" (p. 4).

There are two potential misunderstandings of Griffin's bottom-up approach, both of which he addresses. The first is that it would seem to favor Beitz's (2004) institutional approach, where human rights would be whatever the international community takes them to be. But Griffin believes that when we think of the ethical significance of human rights, we can easily see that not all rights on the various lists of human rights have the same ethical significance. He thinks that the best explanation of the differences in ethical significance is that some rights on the lists are not truly human rights. He gives a list of some of the mistakes, which includes (from the UN Universal Declaration) the right to freedom of residence and the right to protection against attacks on one's honor and reputation (pp. 194-196), the right to equal pay for equal work (p. 187), as well as the right to holidays with pay (p. 186). It may seem disturbing that he would also exclude the right to work from his list of human rights, but this unease is attenuated when he reminds us that he does include in his right to welfare a level of income necessary to be able to exercise one's normative agency (p. 207).

A second potential misunderstanding of Griffin's bottom-up approach is that it would seem to limit human rights to those on which there is an overlapping consensus of the world's major moral and religious doctrines. Griffin takes Rawls's (1999) Law of Peoples, with its "markedly shorter list of human rights" (p. 25), as indicative of this kind of approach. Because it is often thought to be the only intellectually responsible approach to human rights, it is something of a surprise that Griffin rejects it in favor of an "ethnocentric" approach that bases human rights on liberal values, especially the value of normative agency. Griffin argues that it is usually just assumed that the most promising strategy for reaching greater convergence on the justification of human rights is the non-ethnocentric one of seeking justifying ideas that are latent in non-Western cultures. He thinks this is a mistake. He believes that the most promising strategy is the "ethnocentric" strategy of continuing the spread of largely Western-inspired human rights discourse (pp. 26-27, 137-142). As he points out, even if Hinduism, with its caste structure, has no concept of human rights, at the time of independence, Hindus in India were able to see their value (p. 142).

Griffin deserves credit for his willingness to give a philosophical grounding of human rights in substantive values rather than in overlapping consensus. It is unfortunate, however, that he would refer to this as the "ethnocentric" strategy. The term suggests that the Western cultural tradition is a human rights tradition. This seems to me to be a mistake. Someone reading Griffin might be excused for wondering how the Western tradition could have produced the large scale abuses that occurred in the colonization of Africa and the Americas, if it is a human rights tradition. It is more plausible to think that human rights developed in the West as a reaction against abuses, especially religious intolerance, government oppression, and various kinds of discrimination. Such abuses can be found in almost any tradition. Thus, the substantive values protected by human rights are values that can be appreciated by anyone in any tradition. I think that Griffin is correct to think that recent history is evidence that people throughout the world have come to appreciate those values.

Because Griffin bases his theory of human rights on the interest that we have in our normative agency, he believes that his account can be congenial to naturalists. Naturalists can be expected to be hostile to the idea of metaphysically necessary fundamental moral principles, but Griffin thinks that the idea of fundamental human interests is naturalistically respectable. He believes that naturalists would be much more inclined to accept universal human rights if they had not been led astray by Hume's idea that there is an important division between facts and values. Griffin disagrees with Hume on this question. He believes that human nature cannot be understood purely in terms of non-evaluative facts. So he defends an "expansive naturalism" (p. 124) that includes evaluative facts, especially interests. For Griffin, human interests are part of human nature (pp. 116-120). Human interests ground naturalistic values, which, in turn, ground human rights (pp. 124-128).

Many naturalists will find the logic of this proposal unobjectionable. To make his view plausible, Griffin must find a naturalistic basis for an interest in normative agency or for the value that Griffin thinks is grounded in that interest, the value of a worthwhile life or a life of accomplishment (pp. 120-123, 154-156). Though I am sure he will not convince all naturalists, Griffin does a surprisingly good job of doing this and, thus, of making his naturalism about human rights plausible.

Another advantage of basing human rights on interests rather than on principles, is that Griffin can countenance tradeoffs. Here Griffin wants to carve out a position between what he regards as two extremes: (1) the deontologists (e.g., Kant, Gewirth, and Nozick [1974]) who base rights on an exceptionless (or in Nozick's case, nearly exceptionless) principle that does not allow tradeoffs, and (2) the utilitarians (or consequentialists) who are only too willing to trade off rights for welfare.

One view that Griffin does not discuss here, but might well have, is Rawls's (1993) account of liberal rights in Political Liberalism. As I have already mentioned, Griffin criticizes Rawls's list of human rights in The Law of Peoples. However, since it is something like normative agency (full autonomy) that provides the rationale for Rawls's liberal rights covered by his Liberty Principle, it is more apposite for Griffin to compare his list of human rights with Rawls's list of liberal rights. Griffin never does this, so I will shortly. Here I simply mention that, because Rawls grants the liberty principle lexical priority over the difference principle, his theory of liberal rights is like the theories of Kant and the other deontologists mentioned above in that it excludes tradeoffs of rights and well-being. This is unrealistic for the reasons that Griffin discusses. Griffin insists that rights can conflict with welfare in a way that justifies exceptions to rights: "There must be some level of suffering and some level of importance of an exercise of autonomy at which the suffering outweighs the loss of autonomy" (p. 64). So it is an advantage if Griffin can provide a plausible account of how to address tradeoffs.

Griffin realizes that his response to the deontologist makes his position look consequentialist (p. 69). Griffin finds consequentialism unpromising for the usual reasons: (1) he believes that we have no way of making the calculations that consequentialism would require (p. 70), and (2) there are motivational limits on human beings that make consequentialism an unrealistic moral theory for human beings (p. 72). So he advocates a view that is teleological but not consequentialist in the sense that it is not a maximizing view, but "the only values used in the derivation of moral principles are the ends of human life …" (p. 73).

Although there are times when Griffin raises our hopes that he will provide a theory with enough content to resolve difficult tradeoff questions, at the end of the day, all that he can provide is a framework of relevant considerations that go into determining the answers to such questions. This is not surprising. These are hard questions and a bottom-up methodology can only offer slow, gradual progess in addressing them.

What, according to Griffin, are the universal human rights? Griffin argues that, at the level of universal human rights, we find three highest level rights (autonomy, liberty, and welfare rights), which translate into more particular kinds of rights that can vary with the social setting (p. 149). It is useful to compare Griffin's list with Rawls's (1993) list of liberal rights, because Rawls gives very much the same rationale for his list. Griffin's account makes it clear that there are some important rights missing from Rawls's list.

Autonomy rights are those that are necessary for forming a conception of a worthwhile life (p. 155). This standard is above the medical standard of informed consent, but below the Kantian standard of full rationality (pp. 153-4). Though he rejects the Kantian conception of autonomy, Griffin seems to agree with Kant that autonomy requires anti-determinist free-will, at least, if it is to have intrinsic value (p. 157). I find this puzzling. It seems obvious to me that pleasure and pain could have intrinsic value even if determinism were true, so it can't be that determinism rules out intrinsic value.

Perhaps Griffin thinks that what we call "autonomy" could not have intrinsic value if determinism were true. However, if autonomy is understood as acting for reasons, it is hard to see why it would be ruled out by determinism. After all, believing for reasons is not ruled out by determinism. Even if determinism were true, why couldn't acting for reasons have intrinsic value? Griffin never considers this question.

The right to autonomy is a highest level right. It is the source of several lower level rights: for example, the right to life, to freedom from domination, to a certain level of health, and to a certain minimum education and information (pp. 33, 150). Griffin also includes a right to death (p. 221), though he allows that practical considerations could make it impractical to legislate such a right (p. 224).

For Griffin, normative agency requires not only the ability to choose autonomously, it requires the exercise of autonomy, and that in turn requires some liberty rights and some welfare rights. Griffin's human right to liberty is not the right to do whatever one wants; it is a right to the liberty that is necessary for normative agency (pp. 167-168). Griffin thinks it is important to see that what the U.S. Supreme Court at one time characterized as a right to privacy (e.g., in Griswold v. Connecticut) is better understood as a right to liberty (as the court itself acknowledged in Lawrence v. Texas). This distinction is important for Griffin, because he thinks that in the sense in which a right to privacy is a right to privacy of space and of life, there is no such human right (p. 235).

For Griffin, the human right to liberty is the basis for the standard liberal rights to freedom of expression, of religion, and of assembly (p. 159), but it goes beyond them in three ways. First, Griffin has an expansive notion of what these liberty rights involve. For him, they rule out not only active intervention, but also the power that can intimidate people into self-censorship. Second, Griffin's liberty right requires that one have real options (p. 160). For Griffin, a social structure that greatly narrows the life choices available to women or that denies same sex couples the right to marry violates their human right to liberty (pp. 161, 163-4). Third, there are positive preconditions that are part of the right to liberty: "education, basic health, minimum material provision, help to overcome lack of capacities, a fairly rich array of options, and so on" ( p. 162). Some of these items overlap with the welfare rights that Griffin identifies, but that is only to say that the three kinds of rights jointly support each other.

The third category of highest level human rights is welfare rights, understood not as a right to a high level of welfare, but as a right to the level of welfare necessary for normative agency (p. 180). This is a right to a minimum material provision that goes beyond mere subsistence but is lower than the general level of well-being in contemporary Western societies (p. 183). Griffin realizes that most people tend to think of welfare rights as civil, not human, rights (pp. 177-178). So, on this issue, Griffin is proposing a fairly radical revision to most people's ethical views.

In comparing Griffin's human rights with Rawls's liberal rights in Political Liberalism, what is most striking is the expansiveness of Griffin's list. Rawls's list includes no right to subsistence or to health care or to education, even though, applying Rawls's own criterion, such rights would clearly be necessary for the development of the two moral powers -- that is, for full autonomy.[1] So Griffin's account fills in some omissions in Rawls's liberal account. However, there is one item on Rawls's list that is not found on Griffin's list, democratic rights. I return to this issue below.

Because Griffin insists that normative agency is the ground of human rights and that normative agency requires positive as well as negative elements (p. 182); that human rights protect the pursuit of a worthwhile life, not necessarily achieving it (p. 168); and that it is important to focus on what capacities people are actually able to exercise (p. 181); his account most closely resembles the capabilities accounts in the literature. So it comes as a surprise that Griffin never seriously considers how his account compares with other capabilities accounts. Nussbaum (2000), for example, has identified ten Central Human Capabilities that she believes are necessary to living a fully human life. She proposes that human rights be understood as rights to those capabilities. Her criterion for a human right is so close to Griffin's that it would have been useful for Griffin to compare his three rights with Nussbaum's ten.

Because Griffin grounds his account of human rights in human interests and acknowledges that there are other important human interests than our interest in normative agency, a natural question arises: why not include all important human interests as grounds for human rights? Raz (1986) has a view of this kind, which Griffin refers to as pluralist (p. 54). Griffin's strategy in arguing against Raz is to produce examples involving an important human interest where we would agree with Raz that the interest is important enough to establish a correlative duty on others not to violate it, but we would not judge that the violation rises to the level of a human rights violation. Griffin repeatedly invokes one example:

One partner in an unsuccessful marriage, for example, might treat the other coldly and callously, and the suffering caused the second partner over the years might mount up into something much worse than a short period of physical torture. The first partner, however, simply by being cruel, does not violate the second's human rights. (p. 52)

Even if we agree with Griffin about this example, it is hard to know how to evaluate its significance. For example, what about the person who engages in physical torture of another, but never torture so severe that it deprives the victim of normative agency. (Perhaps psychologists could be on call to administer tests to assure that the threshold was not crossed.) I think that most people would still be inclined to regard this kind of case as a violation of human rights. This is not so much an argument against Griffin's view as a reason to question the decisiveness of his argument against Raz.

One test of Griffin's view is whether it draws the line, in a theoretically satisfying way, between the categories of rights that are human rights and the categories that are not. In the final part of his book, Griffin takes up this challenge. I have already mentioned some rights in the UN Universal Declaration that Griffin argues are not human rights. I have also mentioned one right, a right to death, that Griffin thinks is a human right if the practicalities of implementing it can be satisfactorily resolved. Griffin's view on privacy is controversial; he recognizes a liberty-privacy right and an informational privacy right, but not a right to space-and-life privacy (pp. 234-235).

Another somewhat controversial implication of Griffin's view is that group rights are not human rights (p. 276). Griffin is skeptical about group rights that do not reduce to the individual rights of the members of the group (pp. 271-275), but he is willing to allow for the possibility that there may be some basis in justice for some group rights without thinking of them as human rights (p. 276). I find Griffin's discussion of this issue persuasive.

The implication of Griffin's view that I have the most trouble accepting is that there is no human right to democracy (p. 251). It is true that Griffin tries to minimize the damage from this admission by suggesting that "in modern conditions, human rights do indeed require democracy" (p. 254). Here Griffin's bottom-up methodology is in tension with his own account. Historically, democratic rights have been at the center of the Enlightenment human rights project. A bottom-up methodology can easily justify drawing a line that excludes peripheral rights (e.g., the right to holidays with pay). It is much more difficult to justify drawing the line in a way that excludes rights that have been central in the development of the concept of human rights. Still, there is disagreement over whether democratic rights should be included as human rights, so Griffin can be seen as weighing in on a still not completely resolved issue.

Because Griffin takes a bottom-up approach to human rights, he insists that his account is only one proposal to be evaluated by comparison with other counter-proposals. I have already mentioned several alternatives. One further alternative that Griffin considers and dismisses is that human rights might provide the standards for legitimacy of a government. Suppose that we think that a government's moral legitimacy depends on its guaranteeing the human rights on Griffin's list and on its citizens having a fair say in political decisions. If we take moral legitimacy as the standard for human rights, then democratic rights would have to be added to the rights on Griffin's list.

It is true, as Griffin argues, that people can live under a dictatorship and not have any of the rights on his list violated (p. 248). But Griffin seems to think this implies that it is possible for a dictatorship not to violate any human rights (pp. 248-249). I would say something different. Even if, as a matter of fact, a dictator does not impose onerous requirements on his citizens, if he claims the authority to do so then that authority is illegitimate because the citizens do not have a fair say in the process by which legislation is enacted. Griffin is correct to say that justice requires much more than the non-violation of human rights (p. 249). Surprisingly, he thinks that the requirements of legitimacy go beyond the requirements of justice to include promoting the general prosperity (p. 250). This is a very unusual view of legitimacy. Typically legitimacy is regarded as a weaker standard than the standards of justice. In any case, it seems clearly false. If a democratic government that respected all the rights on Griffin's list responded to a genuine majority preference to promote art or literature rather than prosperity, such a government would clearly be legitimate.

In conclusion, let me review some of the many virtues of Griffin's book. The writing style is so clear and compelling that the book could easily be used in an introductory course in political philosophy or the philosophy of human rights. At the same time, Griffin's exposition of his view is so subtle and nuanced and the arguments so careful and cogent that the book is an essential work for specialists in the field. Finally, his book shows that philosophers have an important contribution to make to the conceptual and moral issues that are at the heart of much of the ongoing discourse on the nature and content of human rights.


Beitz, Charles R. 2004. "Human Rights and the Law of Peoples", in Deen Chatterjee, ed., The Ethics of Assistance: Morality and the Distant Needy (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press): 193-214.

Gewirth, Alan. 1978. Reason and Morality (Chicago: Univ. of Chicago Press).

Kant, Immanuel. [1797] 1996. The Metaphysics of Morals, Mary Gregor, tr. and ed. (Cambridge: Cambridge Univ. Press).

Nozick, Robert. 1974. Anarchy, State, and Utopia (New York: Basic Books).

Nussbaum, Martha C. 2000. Women and Human Development (Cambridge: Cambridge Univ. Press).

Raz, Joseph. 1986. The Morality of Freedom (Oxford: Clarendon Press).

Rawls, John. 1993. Political Liberalism (New York: Columbia University Press).

---. 1999. The Law of Peoples. (Cambridge, MA: Harvard Univ. Press).

---. 2001. Justice as Fairness, ed. by Erin Kelly (Cambridge, Mass.: Belknap Press).

[1] Rawls seems to acknowledge this when he says: "The first principle covering the equal basic rights and liberties may easily be preceded by a lexically prior principle requiring that citizens' basic needs be met . . ." (1993, p. 7). In a later discussion, Rawls (2001) outlines the basis for a right to health care (pp. 173-175) and to a social minimum (p. 162), but, on his account, both of these rights would fall under the second principle of justice (the difference principle) and thus would not be accorded the lexical priority of rights under the first principle (the liberty principle).