On Žižek's Dialectics: Surplus, Subtraction, Sublimation

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Fabio Vighi, On Žižek's Dialectics: Surplus, Subtraction, Sublimation, Continuum, 2010, 189pp., $120.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780826464439.

Reviewed by Adrian Johnston, University of New Mexico


With his On Žižek's Dialectics: Surplus, Subtraction, Sublimation, Fabio Vighi provides an interesting and suggestive addition to the rapidly growing body of literature on the internationally renowned Slovenian philosopher and psychoanalytic theorist Slavoj Žižek. Although Vighi's title might lead a potential reader initially approaching this book to expect a sustained discussion of Žižek's Hegelianism specifically -- Hegel is a crucial source of inspiration for Žižekian thought in all its various dimensions (along with Kant, Schelling, Marx, Lacan, and Badiou) -- Vighi devotes the bulk of his attention to critical analyses of the Lacan-inflected facets of Žižek's reflections on matters political. What distinguishes Vighi's intervention from other available treatments of politics à la Žižek is his main thesis that the purported lack of a practical program corresponding to Žižekian theorizations of various recent and contemporary political phenomena is a virtue rather than a vice.

More precisely, Vighi, by his own admission in the spirit if not always the letter of Žižek's writings, argues that the key agenda to be pursued in light of the goal of reviving a demoralized and exhausted radical Left isn't the immediate leap into yet another round of frenzied praxis (what Žižek, inverting a well-known phrase from popular psychology, dubs "aggressive passivity") as impotent outbursts striving in vain to bridge perceived gaps between theory and practice. Instead, from Vighi's perspective, what is called for nowadays is an intra-theoretical labor of thinking, a reflexive contemplative examination of political theory itself (conducted under the guidance of Lacan and Žižek in particular, with comparatively briefer references to Alfred Sohn-Rethel and Kojin Karatani as well). Vighi contends that only through a reinvention of our ideas about politics, including most importantly those of our unconscious fantasies buttressing the very structures of social space and our relations to it, can we even begin to hope to be able to envision paths of political practice with a real shot at achieving lasting, worthwhile change.

Vighi is at his strongest when spelling out some of the fundamental implications of psychoanalysis for political theory. With special focus on Lacan's musings from the period immediately before, during, and after May '68 (i.e., the Lacan of the sixteenth [1968-1969] and seventeenth [1969-1970] seminars), he clearly and helpfully explains how Žižek's coupling of Marx avec Lacan requires thorough-going modifications with respect to (post-)Marxism: alienation is not some transitory and surmountable socio-historical condition, but "subjectivity's very condition of possibility" (p. 4); echoing not only Žižek, but earlier twentieth-century Freudo-Marxism (à la Marcuse et al) (p. 28), Marxist theory and practice is faced with the challenge of integrating psychoanalytic conceptions of the unconscious so as to have a chance of being accurate and effective (pp. 43-44, 67, 70, 72, 79); specifically apropos Lacanian analysis, Marx's radical leftist heirs must take into account manifestations of what Lacan often has in view when speaking of "jouissance" ("enjoyment," especially what the later Lacan, with reference to Marx's surplus-value, names "plus-de-jouir" ["surplus-enjoyment"]) (pp. 57-58). One way to put these points is in the form of a general claim to the effect that a potent, robust critique of political economy is constructible only through taking into careful consideration the operations of the libidinal economy -- and this being particularly so in the era of global, digitalized consumer capitalism with which Žižek famously wrestles again and again. Vighi rightly draws readers' attention to subjects' socio-economically significant investments in things like commodities and careers at the libidinal levels of desires, drives, and fantasies both conscious and unconscious (pp. 27, 33-35, 64).

Furthermore, I wholeheartedly endorse Vighi's diagnosis of the Left's fatal failure to develop and deploy a "politics of jouissance" (pp. 142, 153). As I put it in this exact vein in the preface to Badiou, Žižek, and Political Transformations, "A perplexing, clumsy inability to master the affect-laden aesthetics of mass-media politics is merely one of many sad failings of today's Left. Where is its Leni Riefenstahl?"[1] In other words, Vighi and I, following in Žižek's footsteps, agree that wholly ceding emotive and visceral aestheticizations of politics to the Right, hastily deeming any such gestures as unacceptably "(proto-)fascist," is a grave mistake. An inability to grab people by their guts, to put it crudely, and mobilize their powerful feelings and impulses hobbles the publicly visible representatives of leftism in the late-capitalist universe; such representatives are stuck repeatedly reacting to right-wing movements, the latter having a monopoly on political momentum thanks to playing upon the obscene, violent, and ugly jouissance of racist, xenophobic, misogynistic, homophobic, and jingoistic passions, even if only in implicit, subliminal fashions.[2] But, as Vighi insightfully cautions, getting the juices flowing of a reinvented leftist enthusiasm (as passionate jouissance) is not enough by itself. His central thesis regarding the need for intra-theoretical labors as prior possibility conditions for really transformative extra-theoretical (i.e., practical) programs is directly connected to this caution. One of the very best lines in Vighi's book warns, "before being passionate about its politics, today's left has to reinvent a politics to be passionate about." (p. 15)

Partly in the interest of full disclosure, it should be mentioned that Vighi and I engaged in an earlier exchange in the International Journal of Žižek Studies,[3] an exchange initiated by Vighi's review of my most recent book and orbiting around many of the issues at the heart of his book being reviewed here. Rather than recapitulate what was at stake in that back-and-forth -- the interested reader is referred to the articles cited in the preceding sentence -- I intend in what follows to present new criticisms of Vighi's position I didn't outline previously (and, I feel that my responses to Vighi in the International Journal of Žižek Studies also address Vighi's objections to my work as he articulates them in On Žižek's Dialectics [pp. 135, 175-176]).

I wish to begin by voicing a complaint about Vighi's relative restrictedness of focus. Considering that Žižek is a thinker who thrives through references to a wide range of figures and areas, critical engagements with Žižek call for digging into his favored sources in depth. A brief glance at the bibliography of On Žižek's Dialectics reveals a reliance upon a surprisingly small number of texts by such highly relevant authors as Hegel and Badiou. The portions of Lacan's corpus leaned upon are selectively limited (again, the sixteenth and seventeenth seminars are heavily privileged), especially compared with Žižek's multifaceted employments of the vast full sweep of the Lacanian oeuvre. Kant, Fichte, and Schelling, philosophers crucial for anyone's adequately informed understanding of Hegel, Marx, and dialectics -- both Žižek and Karatani underscore the foundational role of Kantianism in their endeavors -- are absent from the list of references. Related to this, Vighi at one point refers in passing to "the philosophical cliché that there is no place for the individual's free will in German idealism." (p. 108) Considering the well-known fact that Kant and the post-Kantian idealists see themselves as the German intellectual/cultural heirs of the French Revolution united, despite their differences, in the project of reconstructing the entirety of modern philosophy as a philosophy of freedom on the basis of a deep appreciation of radically autonomous subjectivity, it's unclear what Vighi has in mind here.

Moreover, Vighi refrains from addressing much of the prior literature on various aspects of Žižek's body of work. Todd McGowan's 2004 book The End of Dissatisfaction?: Jacques Lacan and the Emerging Society of Enjoyment,[4] Jodi Dean's 2006 book Žižek's Politics,[5] and Thomas Brockelman's 2008 book Žižek and Heidegger: The Question Concerning Techno-Capitalism[6] all cover large portions of the same ground discussed in On Žižek's Dialectics (such as: the myriad new features of post-industrial, late consumer capitalism; the pervasive presence of jouissance in socio-political fields; the twentieth- and early-twenty-first-century historical shifts requiring modifications of Marx's and Freud's ideas; etc.). My own 2008 study of Žižek's dialectics as constructed on the basis of his Lacanian appropriations of Kant, Fichte, Schelling, and Hegel (Žižek's Ontology: A Transcendental Materialist Theory of Subjectivity[7]) likewise receives no mention whatsoever. Apart from Vighi failing to acknowledge when others have made certain points before him, these major omissions leave the reader already acquainted with Žižek scholarship wondering just how substantial a contribution Vighi really offers with his own book.

The narrowness of focus isn't restricted to the bibliography alone. To use an adjectival phrase dear to Hegel, On Žižek's Dialectics suffers from a number of forms of "one-sidedness." For instance, to begin with, Vighi accurately explicates Žižek's uses of Lacan to identify and take issue with particular shortcomings plaguing Marx's concepts and arguments. But he spends no time examining the other side of this, namely, Žižek's complementary Marxist misgivings apropos specific features of Lacan's teachings (including the latter's infamous and pronounced ambivalence vis-à-vis May '68). Turning to another example, Vighi characterizes Žižek's Hegelian dialectics as emphasizing "that the ground on which we stand is always akin to the proverbial ground of our nightmares, insofar as it opens up on the abyss. Dialectics re-instates the primacy of contradiction, the violence of negativity, as that which cuts across every ontology of balance." (p. 91) This makes Žižek sound like the Mao of 1937's "On Contradiction," a Mao to whom Žižek directly addresses a number of objections. For Hegel and Žižek (as well as Badiou), negativity is one, and only one, dimension of dialectical dynamics. Both Žižek and Badiou, particularly with political dimensions in view and for a host of reasons, take great care to stress that their theories of "acts" and "events" respectively aren't just about explosive irruptions of destabilizing destructiveness.[8] They both claim to be at least as interested in the cold, sobering "morning after," the drawn-out struggles to construct durable and lasting revolutionary ways of being and doing.

In fact, Vighi's tacit quasi-Maoist one-sidedness apropos dialectics is not unrelated to the issues that most trouble me about On Žižek's Dialectics. As stated in this review's opening paragraph, the book's novelty with regard to the rest of Žižek scholarship is its plea for reconceiving of the sphere of intra-theoretical (as opposed to practical) activity as the domain within which a true Žižekian act is a real possibility (thus privileging the negativity of subjective critical reflection over the positivity of objective praxis) (pp. 6-7, 112, 153). In addition to how I've already responded to this thesis[9] -- Vighi advocated it in his assessment of Badiou, Žižek, and Political Transformations[10] -- I want here to register an additional series of concerns.

Psychoanalysis obviously is integral to these conversations. And, analytic notions of the end of analysis, notions generative of much controversy and debate in clinical circles from Freud up through the present (Lacanian ones included), reveal questions and problems with precise analogues in Vighi's handling of the theory-practice rapport. One of Freud's very late texts is "Analysis Terminable and Interminable" (1937), an essay devoted to considering what constitutes a satisfactory concluding moment when an analysis can and should be brought to a close. In terms of the sort of theoretical (rather than clinical) analyses with which Vighi is occupied, one wonders about "theorizing terminable and interminable." As Freud is the first to acknowledge, any analysis could in principle continue on indefinitely until death since the unconscious is an ineliminable side of the psychical apparatus. In the absence of clearly formulated criteria stipulating what the end of political theorizing might look like (in both senses of "end"), Vighi risks sounding as though he's attempting to justify an interminable process of intra-theoretical reflection as an end-in-itself sans practice (or, in Žižekian parlance, a politics without politics). Although he speaks to this worry (pp. 141-142, 149-151), he doesn't, in my opinion, succeed at satisfactorily addressing it and putting it to rest.

Admittedly, there genuinely is something to Vighi's finely-worded final remarks about political thinkers needing (in Lacanese) to "traverse their fantasies," thereby learning to put their theoretical unconsciouses to work in the service of envisioning new collective possibilities (pp. 155, 158-159, 163-164). But, as indicated immediately above, the ineliminability of the unconscious means this intra-theoretical self-analysis could go on and on solipsistically without ever leading to anything beyond itself (in terms of extra-theoretical acts, actions, practice[s], etc.). Furthermore, a straightforward question ought to be posed in this context: If it were simply a matter of thinking our way out of the old and into the new, then why hasn't this happened yet given that a plethora of great minds (Žižek, for instance) have devoted and continue to devote themselves to this task of thinking?

Psychoanalysis provides an answer to this question: Self-analysis via a silent intellectual inner monologue is doomed to severe inadequacy and ineffectiveness. Despite his repeated recourse to the analytic concept of the unconscious, Vighi's central argumentative line is in danger of having to rely upon an implicit and very un-psychoanalytic voluntarism according to which reflexive theoretical self-consciousness by itself is willing and able to pinpoint and overcome its own blind spots. Just as analytic therapy relies upon a dialectic between subjectivity and objectivity -- the latter involves the voicing aloud through free-associational speech of one's subjective soliloquy to another addressee as well as the ongoing living of one's life off the couch and outside the consulting room -- so too must an efficacious leftist politics bring its unconscious dimensions to light through an interweaving of the thinking of the theoretical and the acting of the practical. The intra-theoretical without the simultaneous extra-theoretical isn't likely to get very far; storming the brain without storming the gates has its limits. Or, as Trotsky expresses it, "one learns to ride on horseback only when sitting on the horse."[11]

[1] Adrian Johnston, Badiou, Žižek, and Political Transformations: The Cadence of Change, Evanston: Northwestern University Press, 2009, p. xiv.

[2] Johnston, Badiou, Žižek, and Political Transformations, pp. xiv, 172-173; Vighi, On Žižek's Dialectics, pp. 15, 115.

[3] Fabio Vighi, "On Practicing Theory: Some Remarks on Adrian Johnston's Badiou, Žižek, and Political Transformations," and Adrian Johnston, "Meta-Dialectics and the Balancing Acts of Žižekianism: A Response to Fabio Vighi," International Journal of Žižek Studies, vol. 4, no. 1, 2010.

[4] Todd McGowan, The End of Dissatisfaction?: Jacques Lacan and the Emerging Society of Enjoyment, Albany: State University of New York Press, 2004; cf. Adrian Johnston, "Unable to Enjoy: A Review of Todd McGowan's The End of Dissatisfaction?," South Atlantic Review, vol. 70, no. 1, Winter 2005, pp. 165-169.

[5] Jodi Dean, Žižek's Politics, New York: Routledge, 2006.

[6] Thomas Brockelman, Žižek and Heidegger: The Question Concerning Techno-Capitalism, London: Continuum, 2008.

[7] Adrian Johnston, Žižek's Ontology: A Transcendental Materialist Theory of Subjectivity, Evanston: Northwestern University Press, 2008.

[8] Johnston, Žižek's Ontology, pp. 264-268.

[9] Johnston, "Meta-Dialectics and the Balancing Acts of Žižekianism."

[10] Vighi, "On Practicing Theory."

[11] Leon Trotsky, Terrorism and Communism: A Reply to Karl Kautsky (ed. Slavoj Žižek]), London: Verso, 2007, p. 97.