On Location: Aristotle's Concept of Place

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Morison, Benjamin, On Location: Aristotle's Concept of Place, Oxford University Press, 2002, 202pp, $45.00, ISBN 0199247919.

Reviewed by Mohan Matthen, University of British Columbia


Most philosophers can recite the one-sentence summary of Aristotle’s theory of place: the place of x is the first (i.e., innermost) motionless boundary of the thing that contains x (Phy IV 4, 212a20-21). How did Aristotle arrive at this view? What is the entity of which he was trying to give an account, and what are the (supposed) phenomena that he was trying to accommodate? How did he deal with the obvious difficulties that plague his conception? Benjamin Morison’s admirably clear and comprehensive monograph offers the untutored reader an excellent entry into such questions. Morison is well-schooled in both the interpretative literature on Aristotle’s theory and the analytic literature on place and related concepts, and anyone who is not quite up to speed either on how to read Physics IV, 1-5 or on how to assess the philosophical worth of the theory articulated there will find in this book a self-contained and relatively painless crash course. The expositions of the “six dimensions” in chapter 1, of location in chapter 2, of Zeno’s paradox of place in chapter 3, and of matter and form in chapter 4, are models of sound exposition of difficult texts. Even for the expert, these commentaries are useful records from which relevant Aristotelian references can be recovered without much effort.

Let us turn now to Aristotle’s famous definition, quoted above. What is the thing that contains x? Surely there are many, for I am, at this moment, in Vancouver, Canada, North America, and so on. Morison argues, persuasively, that Aristotle’s unique container is what he (i.e., Morison) calls the “maximal surrounder” of x, the “body which surrounds x such that all the other bodies which surround x are parts of it” (p. 138). This maximal surrounder is, of course, the universe, which turns out, therefore, to be the common container of all bodies. The place of x is an interior surface of the universe, the interior surface that is created by x. This inner surface fits x exactly: “the inner limit of x’s surroundings marks the beginning of the outside world … it is the first thing in which x is” (p. 142).

But consider now a boat in a river. The water of the river is moving, and the boat is moving with it in such a way that it is always touching the same water. It seems that the inner surface of the universe created by the boat stays the same in this case. So it seems that the boat stays in the same place. Since Aristotle defines movement as change of place, this has the unwanted consequence that the boat is not moving. By the same token, a stationary boat in a flowing river would constantly change its place, and thus be moving according to Aristotle’s definition. Morison interprets Aristotle’s response to this puzzle (at Phy IV 4, 212a14-21) as follows: the inner limit that constitutes the boat’s place is not the inner limit of the river water, but the inner limit of the river itself (p. 152). There is a difference between these limits, Morison claims: the inner surface of the river itself is, at any given moment, constituted by the inner surface of the water that happens to coincide with it. But constitution is not identity, since at another moment the same surface of an immobile thing like the river, or of the universe, could be constituted by a different surface of the moving water. “The inner surface of the universe at which it is in contact with the [boat] (as long as [it] remains stationary) remains the same,” he says, “even though it is constituted at different times by different surfaces of water” (p. 154). In order to identify the place of a thing, one has to identify some motionless container. There is always such a container because in the last instance everything is in the universe, and the universe is stationary.

Morison’s interpretation is clever, but it is open to a seemingly damaging objection. In his conception, place turns out to be immaterial (or so it seems to me): it is constituted by matter, of course, but it is not itself identical with any material body. But (as we shall see in a moment) Aristotle wants place to be causally significant. Can a bare location – an entity that is one despite the multiplicity of bodily entities that constitute it at different times – be causally significant? (Cf. Can the Ship of Theseus be causally active except in virtue of the matter that constitutes it at any given time?) This question goes right to the heart of Aristotle’s conception of place, and also draws together a number of threads in Morison’s discussion. For these reasons, it is worth discussing in some detail. As it happens, I do not think that Morison gets these matters exactly right, though in the end his interpretation is sustainable despite small missteps.

Is place real? One of Aristotle’s reasons for thinking that it is real is his insistence that (some?) places have “a certain potency,” (dunamis) since each of his elements is “carried to its own place, provided that nothing interferes” (Phy IV 1, 208b10-12). For example, earth is carried to the centre of the universe; this shows that the centre of the universe has potency, and must hence be real. The definition of place must accommodate the causal potency of at least this particular place. What is the nature of the “potency” of the centre of the universe? Many commentators answer in a way that is seemingly influenced by Newton’s theory of gravitation: Ross, for example, supposes that the centre of the universe exerts an “attractive influence” on earth (see Morison, p. 50 n). This is an anachronism, as Morison rightly points out, for in Aristotle’s theory, the centre is not the efficient cause of earth’s motion (as an attractive influence would be), but a constituent of its formal cause. In other words, it is causally significant because the centre of the universe forms a part of the definition of earth. Morison gives this definition as follows: earth is defined as that which goes down, or towards the centre.

Morison is quite right to invoke definitions (and formal causes) in this context, but he does not get Aristotle’s definition of earth quite right. He suggests that Aristotle defines earth in terms of a direction and destination of movement; but in fact Aristotle defined it in terms of stasis. It is certainly true that downward motion is part of the nature of earth (cf. De Caelo I 2, 268b28). But this natural motion is in turn explained by the place at which earth is naturally at rest (DC III 2, 300a20-b8). The explanation runs as follows. Suppose that the defining essence of earth is to be at the centre. Now consider a clod of earth that is displaced from the centre. This clod is not fully actualized: it is not at the centre, as its defining essence demands. In order to realise its essence, it needs to move toward the centre. Thus it has a potency to move to the centre; this potency is actualized if nothing hinders the movement of the clod. The actualization of the potency is the falling motion of the clod. Note that earth’s motile tendency is not the ultimate cause here; the ultimate cause is rather the end of the motion – and this end is a resting state. This reliance on the end of motion is characteristic of Aristotle’s teleological explanations in science.

Now, how does this theory show that place has a “certain potency”? On the face of it, the theory seems to show only that earth does. Suppose that I am a sceptic about the existence of places. Then I would be inclined to think that although

(1) I live at a location 49.5 degrees north,

it is nonetheless the case that

(2) Nothing is a location 49.5 degrees north.

Given my reluctance to concede that (1) implies the reality of place, I will surely not be inclined to concede that my tendency to return to a location 49.5 degrees north shows that this location has a “certain potency” and is hence real. For whatever strategy I use to make (1) and (2) consistent, that strategy will surely suffice to make

(3) I have a tendency to return to a (particular) location that is 49.5 degrees north whenever I am away

consistent with (2).

It seems, therefore, that Aristotle’s argument must have some hidden premises. What are these? Here again, Morison does not get Aristotle’s theory exactly right. He suggests early in his exposition that a certain place (namely, the centre of the universe) is predicated of earth, and he argues that the doctrine of predicables articulated by Aristotle in the Categories will therefore assign some reality to this place, albeit a reality that is subordinate to the reality of earth. (See p. 4; note that the complication introduced on p. 5 is irrelevant to this point.)

This is inaccurate. Consider:

(4) I am in Vancouver.

Is Vancouver predicated of me in (4)? Not at all. What is predicated of me above is being in Vancouver, or disregarding the copula as Aristotle customarily does when specifying predicables, in Vancouver. Vancouver is not the same as in Vancouver; the doctrine of the Categories shows only that the latter is (subordinately) real, not that Vancouver, or 49.5 degrees, is. Aristotle is perfectly well aware of this. In Categories 4, the relevant category is not place, but where. Where am I according to (4)? The proper non-elliptical answer is not “Vancouver” but “in Vancouver”. Thus consider:

(5) Earth is fully actualized in the centre of the universe.

(5) attributes a “where” to earth not a place, and the argument of the Categories shows that this where has (subordinate) reality, but not that the place implicated in it is also real. By the same token,

(6) Earth naturally moves to the centre of the universe

implies that a particular whither has causal significance, and perhaps that this whither has a “certain potency”; it does not directly imply that the centre of the universe has any potency.

Now, Morison does recognize the difference between locatives (i.e., wheres and whithers) and places. But he thinks that there is some easy transition from one to the other. This is not right. He is simply off-base in the suggestion he conveys when he says, “’place’ would be the abstract noun corresponding to ‘where’, as ‘quantity’ corresponds to ‘how much’” (p. 4). For in fact, as Ackrill notes in his Clarendon Aristotle Series commentary on Categories 6, Aristotle “uses no abstract noun for ‘quantity’ but employs everywhere the interrogative-adjective [how much].” Exactly the same holds true for ‘where’ – he never uses ‘place’ in the Categories to reify ‘where’. (Does he do this anywhere else?) True, Aristotle does identify non-substantial entities such as points, lines, numbers, and the like as quantities. And places fall into this category as well. And so one might think that the causal influence of a where is transferable to place. But this transition is not straightforward. Note first of all that locatives fall into one category, the category of “where,” and places into another, the category of “how much”. And as we have noted, wheres are predicated of substances, while places are not. Thus, there is no obvious way in which an account of the causal potency of place can be extracted from an account of the causal potency of locatives. Secondly, Aristotle does not say in the Categories that there is a place for every bodily location (though he does imply this in the Physics). As far as the Categories is concerned, all that can be drawn from (6) is that earth has a certain potency in virtue of its defining where, not that the centre of the universe has any potency. The reality of place cannot be proved by logic. One cannot simply assume that corresponding to every “in x” predicate, there is a real x, or, as Morison puts it, that “our practice of saying where something is depends on the existence of proper places” (p. 80).

Aristotle holds that (5) and (6) imply that the centre of the universe has a certain potency. We have seen that Morison’s way of explicating this claim is on the wrong track: the causal potency of a place is not simply transferred from the causal potency of a where or whither that implicates that place. What is the right way of understanding Aristotle’s claim? Obviously, a brief review is not the place to get into this question in depth. (I have, however, dealt with it in detail in “The Holistic Presuppositions of Aristotle’s Cosmology,” Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy XX [Summer 2001].) Very briefly, one has to take seriously that Aristotle holds that the universe itself is a natural substance with natural movements, and that places like the centre and the periphery play a role in this entity akin to that played by organs – functional parts – in an animal. My lungs have a certain potency that suffices to explain some of the things I do, and so they are real. However, because they are parts of me defined by their function in the whole, they are ontologically subordinate to me. The same can be said about the centre of the universe with respect to the universe. It too has a certain potency defined by its role in the whole. Note that this way of explaining how Aristotle attributes causal potency to place does not assume that every place has potency. There is no direct route from the truth of (3) to the causal potency of a location that is 49.5 degrees north.

Let us return then to the question of whether Morison’s way of interpreting Aristotle’s definition of place allows for places, as distinct from locatives, to have causal potency. I have been arguing that it does not, and that there is no easy transition from the causal influence of locatives to the causal influence of immaterial places. This might not defeat Morison’s interpretation, however. Aristotle’s theory does not demand that all places be causally significant. It only demands that some places be so, for instance the centre of the universe. Even these places are immaterial in the sense given above, that is, they retain their identity despite the fact that they are constituted by different material bodies at different times. However, places like the centre of the universe are identifiable by a formal property of the universe itself. Not all places can be so identified: there is no geometrical property of the spherical universe that enables me to identify my proper place, for example. It seems to follow that there are some places that have no causal significance: 49.5 degrees north has none, even though I keep returning there. These places might nonetheless be real. It is possible that immaterial surfaces are real members of the category of how much even though they are causally inert: it is possible, for instance, that their reality is implied by “replacement”, i.e., the possibility of something now occupying the same place as was occupied before by something else.