On Loving Our Enemies: Essays in Moral Psychology

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Jerome Neu, On Loving Our Enemies: Essays in Moral Psychology, Oxford University Press, 2012, 260pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199862986.

Reviewed by Jonathan Schofer, Reed College


I strongly recommend Jerome Neu's volume for readers interested in ethics, emotion, fantasy, selfhood, and law, and also for those interested in Freudian method and theory, aspects of Descartes and Sartre, and Plato. Neu himself characterizes the book as follows:

in this volume essays on the ethics of emotion, the ethics of fantasy, the ethics of authenticity, the complexities of self-deception, and the formation of the superego are front and center. Freedom -- from questions about the degree of control we have over our emotions to the psychological conditions for criminal responsibility -- is a pervasive theme (vii).

An important element in Neu's work is his contribution to the philosophical consideration of Freud and of the psychoanalytic method, particularly with respect to ethics. Readers interested in Freud from the standpoint of philosophical ethics often rely on a handful of scholarly treatments, such as those by Phillip Rieff, Paul Ricoeur, Richard Wollheim, and Jonathan Lear. Neu's essays build upon the work of these scholars and should be considered among the valuable resources that we have for integrating psychoanalytic approaches into our philosophical considerations of selfhood and ethics.

On Loving Our Enemies is a collection of essays, most of which were published individually in other settings. In important respects, the organization of the essays makes for a volume that is greater than the sum of its parts. The fourteen chapters can be organized into five groups or sections that I characterize as follows:

(A) Ethical considerations regarding emotion, fantasy, and authenticity

1. On Loving Our Enemies: The Ethics of Emotion

2. The Ethics of Fantasy

3. Authenticity and the Examined Life

(B) The importance of Freud for ethics, particularly in contrast with Descartes and Sartre

4. Divided Minds: Sartre's "Bad Faith" Critique of Freud

5. Encyclopedia Entries on Freud

6. Genetic Explanation in Totem and Taboo

7. Descartes' Dreams

(C) Ethics, the psyche, and contemporary law

8. Minds on Trial

9. More Speech, Better Speech as the Best Defense

(D) Plato and his legacy

10. Euthyphro, the Legal Realists, and the Dilemma of Authenticity

11. Plato's Analogy of State and Individual: The Republic and the Organic Theory of the State

(E) Neu's responses to other philosophers and interpreters of Freud

12. Short Reviews

13. Unger's Knowledge and Politics

14. Rely to My Critics

In my reading, the discussions of Freud in Chapters 4 through 7 (B) provide the theoretical heart of the book, and the treatments of law in Chapters 8 and 9 (C) show most clearly the force and significance of a philosophical attention to emotion, fantasy, intention, and speech. The essays are interwoven in several other respects. Neu appeals to Freud throughout the book as a theoretical and methodological inspiration. Sartre and Descartes appear as opponents in several places, particularly Chapters 3, 4, 7, and also 10. Plato is an important yet problematic figure discussed early, especially in Chapter 4, and becomes especially prominent in Chapters 10 and 11. Neu's consideration of law and the state extends beyond Chapters 8 and 9 into the following two chapters.

The arrangement of papers has weaknesses as well. Chapters 1 through 3 raise important points on provocative issues, but I found them to be more compelling after studying Neu's account of Freud in successive chapters. They ask: How much can and should we control our emotions? How much can and should we ethically evaluate and try to control our fantasies? What is the value of authenticity and self-examination? When Neu's account of consciousness and the unconscious is clear, which he sets out in Chapter 4 and following, these chapters gain clarity and force.

Chapter 4 elaborates key conceptual points that inform many of his other studies, and I will review these arguments in some detail. In this essay, Neu engages Freud and Sartre to take a stance regarding the concept of the unconscious. He upholds Freud's picture of a divided mind and rejects Descartes' and Sartre's pictures of a unified and transparent consciousness. Early in the essay Neu writes:

The mind for Sartre was by definition the conscious mind, the indivisible conscious mind. And existentialist that he was, Sartre believed in unconditional freedom. His position did not allow for hidden, subterranean, forces determining our choices in a way that might leave us without responsibility (67).

At various places in On Loving Our Enemies, Neu upholds a conditional freedom that is an achievement rather than a given, and he gives great attention to hidden, subterranean forces that influence our choices. Sartre presents a theory of "bad faith" that aims to provide an alternative to psychoanalysis. Neu says of Sartre:

I believe his account of the paradoxes of self-deception is very helpful, and his alternative account of the mechanisms of (apparent) self-deception in terms of patterns of bad faith gives a vivid picture of some of the ways in which we trip over ourselves in our efforts at self-expression and self-understanding. I believe also, however, that his account of certain patterns of bad faith (as stylized denials of freedom) provides only a partial picture of the (larger) realm of self-deception. While he captures some of the ways in which we trip over ourselves, there are many others. Our resources for self-deception are vast. And in this territory, psychoanalysis is often a better guide. Recognizing this involves abandoning some of Sartre's favored positions -- such as belief in the Cartesian unity and transparency of consciousness, and faith in unconditional freedom -- but these are in any case questionable (67).

The book as a whole calls for abandoning belief in the unity and transparency of consciousness, and unconditional freedom, and draws upon psychoanalysis to explore deception of oneself and of others.

Neu's first task is to clarify self-deception. If self-deception is a lie to oneself, then self-deception implies intention and knowledge on the part of the liar. A lie is not just a mistake, but involves choice. How can you intentionally forget what you know?

Paradox seems inevitable if we attempt to understand self-deception on the model of other-deception. Other-deception, as in the ordinary case of lying, requires that the deceiver know the truth while keeping the deceived from knowing it. But in the case of self-deception, the two parties are collapsed into a single person, and the problem arises of how one person can simultaneously know (as he must, if he is to be a deceiver) and not know (as he must, if he is to be deceived) a single thing (68).

According to Neu, in a Cartesian view of self-knowledge, my mind is known to me directly and incorrigibly, so self-deception on the model of other-deception is impossible (I am suspicious that Neu's account of Descartes' and Sartre's pictures of self-knowledge on 68-69 oversimplifies, but I do not have the expertise to give a sufficient counter-interpretation). In Freud's understanding of the mind as "split" into conscious and unconscious, "one may on one level (the unconscious) know, while on another level (the conscious) one does not know" (69). The internal censor, functionally defined as an unconscious aspect of the ego, must know what is to be repressed in order to hide the truth from the conscious part of the ego, so there is no paradox (70). The mind, then, is divisible. Neu considers examples of "split brains" to reinforce his point, but he emphasizes that the "more ordinary phenomena of internal conflict make the notion of an indissoluble unity at best an ideal to be striven for rather than a given in the human condition" (72). Still, a problem remains: "how is one to partition the mind or self in a principled way for the purposes of theory?" (72). Neu reminds us that Freud's account is not the only way to theorize the self as partitioned, as is evident by considering Plato's tripartite picture (73).

For Freud, the unconscious is not a second consciousness, even though we believe in the unconscious within us based on the same sort of inference that leads us to believe in the consciousness of others. Sartre, though, identifies ambiguities in Freud's account. Is the unconscious simply a mechanism, or does it have perceptiveness and purposiveness? If repression is not purely mechanical, what "selectively directs" the application of the energy of repression? (75-76). Neu highlights that these questions open up much larger issues:

Does purposiveness require consciousness? Is mechanism compatible with purposiveness? This is the cluster of issues which reemerges in contemporary debates about the suitability and limits of computer models for the mind. The problems are not peculiar to psychoanalysis, though we may perhaps more readily see how they arise there. It is the apparent purposiveness of resistance that makes Freud (and at least some of us) regard resistance as a psychical act despite the fact that its occurrence may be as unconscious as the operation of the liver. But then the functioning of the liver is also apparently purposive; at least it serves a purpose. What makes a function or a process? Is it a question of the organ that performs it (the brain)? Is it a matter of having a propositional content? If consciousness is not necessary, what is? . . . And does the operation of semi-independent systems of reasons and mental causes require the postulation of semi-independent agents of consciousness? (77)

According to Neu, Sartre criticizes Freud in part "to insist that people have choices in many more situations than they acknowledge, and so are responsible for more than they would acknowledge." Neu writes, "I believe this is true, but it is misleading to conclude that people always have a choice" (78). Neu reviews Sartre's examples of conscious suppression and then refers to Freud's case studies to assert that some states, such as hostility, can only be explained through the unconscious:

In the case of the Rat Man, the hostility that lies behind many of his symptoms is unconscious. He cannot accept the ambivalence in his love towards his father and a certain lady, and the denial of the component hostility involves repression. Unconscious repression is a standard mechanism in many neuroses on Freud's analysis, and thus a common mechanism of self-deception (82).

Neu ends by saying that Sartre's moral goals can be achieved more effectively by recognizing Freudian claims: "Indeed, the recovery of the unconscious, once it is acknowledged, may open up the path to increased freedom and self-determination. The discovery that you have been unfree may be the first step towards your greater freedom." He states here and several other places in the volume: "it is misleading to treat freedom as other than a matter of degree," and in addition, the law recognizes that responsibility is also a matter of degree. "Our control over who we are and the consequences of our acts is typically incomplete. It should not be surprising if our knowledge of such things is often confused and subject to self-deception" (83).

Neu's rejection of Cartesian pictures of consciousness such as Sartre's, and Neu's support of Freud's theories and methods, bring claims that underlie many chapters in On Loving Our Enemies to the forefront: the unconscious exists; we have only partial knowledge and control of our fantasies and desires; we must employ examination and inference to know ourselves as well as to know others; we should strive to identify and undo self-deception; freedom is a matter of degree, and we can build freedom through self-examination; psychoanalysis is a key procedure and exemplary model for that self-examination; responsibility is a necessary component of law and ethics but needs to be understood through these complexities. These claims inform and are elaborated through Neu's study of attempts to extend the range of our love (Chapter 1), his cautions regarding control or regulation of fantasy (Chapter 2), his consideration of authenticity and his emphasis on self-examination (Chapter 3), his complex picture of intention and the law (Chapter 8), and problems he identifies in knowledge and authority (Chapter 10).

Neu's book reviews reveal his ability to incorporate critical moments into supportive and collaborative engagements with other scholars (Chapters 12 and 13). Along with my strong recommendation of On Loving Our Enemies, I see three areas with ambiguity or problems: his stance within psychoanalysis, his references to religion, and his account of power as part of social relations and the production of knowledge. First, Neu is not entirely explicit about his relative commitments to (a) Freud's theories and methods, (b) a strand of psychoanalytic theory and practice in the present, and (c) the minimal claims concerning the unconscious that he needs for his reflections on moral psychology. In part, this ambiguity exists because he tends to write in support of elements of Freud's work in relation to actual or potential critics, such as Sartre. On Loving Our Enemies has relatively few discussions of criticisms as well as developments of Freud's work by later psychoanalysts (see the book reviews in Chapter Twelve for some such discussions). The distinct nuances of Neu's formulations, as compared to other psychoanalytic theories, remains less clear than would be ideal.

Second, Neu's references to religion are few but problematic. I note three. In discussing Plato's Euthyphro, Neu writes regarding knowledge of God's existence and wishes: "revelation is hard to come by" (173-174) and "direct, unambiguous revelation is rare" (176). Given this rarity, he sets out an opposition between "hard thinking" and "turning the decisions over to some authority" (176-177). Religious knowledge, and not only religious knowledge, is developed and transmitted through many mechanisms beyond direct revelation, including sacred texts, commentary, liturgy, and ritual practices. A discussion of authority, knowledge, and justification needs to move beyond Neu's options to consider more complex relations between individual investigation and reasoning, social forms and institutions, and power and authority.

As a secondary concern, Neu's own writing is ambiguous on the status of sacred texts in the first chapter. He begins the chapter, and thus also the book, with the words: "The scripture for today is Matthew 5:43-48." Neu proceeds to elaborate on "Christ's message" (1). This opening terminology emphasizing the New Testament and Christ raises the question: how Christian is On Loving Our Enemies and how Christian is Neu as a thinker? The strong Christian phrasing does not carry through the book, which leaves me wondering what the opening is meant to convey. As a minor but not unimportant point, Neu invokes a dated and problematic picture of modernity's relation to Christianity in a short comment about Plato's Euthyphro: "there are important differences between the modern virtue of piety and its ancient Greek counterpart. Christianity has intervened between them and us" (173). Surely we should be clear that the historical transmission and interpretation of ancient Greek sources involved at least Judaism and Islam along with Christianity, and also that today's readers of Neu's book may find all three of those traditions and more "between" themselves and the world of Plato.

Finally, Neu's studies often show a strong awareness of institutions and power relations, particularly his considerations of law in Chapters 8 and 9, but also less obvious topics such as the transformation of emotions:

But then, we should be alert to the possibility that therapy and education can lapse into distasteful manipulation. We should remember that advertising too assumes attitudes are subject to change. And torture can transform. Remember that, at the end of George Orwell's 1984, the rebel Winston Smith, through the hard (or should we say, "difficult"?) path of "Room 101," has been driven to the point where "He loved Big Brother" (Orwell 1949). Is love with a causal history of this sort still "love"? The techniques of transformation are in need of scrutiny (18; also see Chapter Thirteen and his concluding reference to Habermas on 230, and his review of Hampshire's Innocence and Experience on 204-205).

Still, Neu has only limited engagement with theories and analyses of social power. He tends to defend therapy as therapeutic and science as bringing understanding (especially but not only in 208-214). These elements of Neu's work would benefit from a more explicit examination of knowledge and power, whether through Habermas and Foucault, or through less frequently invoked writers such as Ivan Illych and Andre Gorz.

To conclude: Jerome Neu has given us a careful, wide-ranging, thoughtful, nicely written, and often quite powerful book. I recommend On Loving Our Enemies with great enthusiasm.