On Loyalty and Loyalties: The Contours of a Problematic Virtue

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John Kleinig, On Loyalty and Loyalties: The Contours of a Problematic Virtue, Oxford University Press, 2014, 315pp., $35.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780199371266.

Reviewed by Simon Keller, Victoria University of Wellington


John Kleinig's book is a thoughtful and thorough examination of loyalty and its ethical significance. It presents an original account of loyalty's place among the virtues and insightful discussions of several difficult questions on which considerations of loyalty bear, ranging across professional and applied ethics and social and political philosophy.

In the first half of the book, Kleinig presents a cautiously positive picture of the ethics of loyalty. He argues that loyalty is a genuine virtue, but a problematic virtue: loyalty is essential for good human social life, but susceptible to abuse and in special need of restraint and guidance by the other virtues. In the second half of the book, Kleinig works through a series of ethical puzzles raised by particular forms of loyalty, with chapters on friendship, loyalty to family, loyalty to organizations, professional loyalty, nationalism, patriotism, and loyalty to God.

The book is long, and different parts of it will appeal to different audiences. Several of the strongest discussions are self-contained, however, and most are presented in an accessible style. I especially recommend the chapter on loyal opposition, which explores and evaluates the varieties of political dissent; the chapter on organizational loyalty, which gives a sensitive treatment of organizational pressures and the ethics of whistle-blowing; the chapter on professional loyalty, which argues that professionals owe loyalty not to clients but to professional communities; and the chapters on nationalism and patriotism, which give a unified account of virtuous loyalty to country.

Kleinig's discussions of particular loyalties are resourceful and rewarding, and his overall view of the ethics of loyalty marks out a significant new position in the literature. His defence of that overall view, in my opinion, is less compelling than the other elements of the book. In this review I will try to explain and evaluate Kleinig's story about what loyalty is and why it is a virtue, and to say where this places him in the larger debate. Kleinig styles himself as a champion of loyalty against its critics, but his differences with those critics, I think, turn out to be quite minor. My one main complaint about the book is that Kleinig overstates the significance of his arguments in favor of loyalty, and sometimes misrepresents, so as to make look more extreme, the views of those he takes as his opponents, including me. (Me!)

To be loyal to something, for Kleinig, is to value it (and your relationship with it) intrinsically, and to stick with it even when doing so is not convenient (18-32). When you value something (and your relationship with it) intrinsically, Kleinig suggests, you usually invest some of your identity in it, and you value its interests almost as though they were your own (20, 82-84, 106). Loyal action can take many different forms, but there are two expressions of loyalty that Kleinig treats as paradigmatic: first, doing what is best for a loved one when narrowly selfish considerations tempt you elsewhere (17), and second, resolving to improve a troubled relationship or organization from within rather than leaving (76-79).

In light of that characterization of loyalty, there is no guarantee that being loyal, in a given case, is good. Sticking with a given person or organization might mean acting wrongly. Valuing a given person or organization intrinsically might mean valuing it mistakenly (136). Kleinig accepts these and other concerns about loyalty in individual cases, but says that loyalty, construed as a general character trait, is nevertheless an "excellence of persons" (52, 67). This slightly hedged endorsement of loyalty sets Kleinig apart from more familiar treatments in the literature.

Philosophers usually approach loyalty either enthusiastically or suspiciously. The enthusiastic say that loyalty is a foundational virtue that shapes and supports many other important virtues, and they blame a decline in respect for loyalty for all kinds of social and philosophical malaise (Royce 1908; Oldenquist 1982; MacIntyre 1984, Rorty 1997; Fletcher 1993). The suspicious view loyalty as a threat to liberal morality and independent thought, and they say that loyalty in general is not a virtue and that particular loyalties are desirable only when they meet specified independent ethical standards (Baron 1984; Ewin 1992, 1993; Keller 2007). Against this background, Kleinig's view of loyalty as a problematic virtue can claim to be the moderate view, and perhaps the view of common sense.

Kleinig's case for his moderate view is largely defensive in content and tone, and is directed mainly against those who are suspicious of loyalty. Sometimes Kleinig's tactic is to concede ground to concerns about loyalty but say that loyalty might be a virtue anyway. Yes, loyalty can be misplaced, but so too can conscientiousness (81). Yes, loyalty sometimes fails to be praiseworthy, but so too does courage (58-59). Yes, loyalty is valuable only when it is discriminating, but so too is generosity (67). Yes, loyalty can be exploited, but so too can kindness (109). At other times, Kleinig responds to worries about loyalty by moving the emphasis. A loyal employee might stick with a firm even against her better judgment, true, but she might instead stick with the firm because she values its success and viability and is prepared to sacrifice her narrow self-interest for the firm's sake (62). Tying these defensive moves together is Kleinig's suggestion that loyalty is an "executive" virtue, meaning that its function is to hold steady the "substantive" virtues, like justice and compassion: absent the substantive virtues, loyalty is likely to misfire (55-56).

Kleinig's positive case for considering loyalty a virtue is brief and a little scattered. He says that common sense regards loyalty as a virtue and common sense should be trusted, but this consideration arises only in passing (284). He agrees with other writers that loyalties play a central role in constructing our distinctive characters and identities, but thinks this consideration too "egoistic" to establish loyalty as a virtue (79-82). The really important point in favor of loyalty, he says, is that it expresses and secures valuable relationships (82-84). Loyalty is the "associative glue" that generates the goods of shared human life (9). Kleinig spends only a few pages dealing with this claim directly, but the discussions of particular loyalties in the rest of the book are intended to make it convincing. Without loyalty there can be no genuine friendship and no close family bonds; without loyalty clubs, large organizations, and states cannot carry out their proper functions. Once we see how loyalty sustains many valuable parts of human life, Kleinig suggests, we will see why it is properly counted a virtue.

As I see it, Kleinig does a good job of showing that loyalty is indispensible for good human social life, but not of showing it to follow that loyalty is a virtue, or of undermining rival accounts. Consider an analogous claim. There are many things of great value that we can have only because we are able to engage in pretense. Pretense is an essential part of childhood and adult play, of the production and appreciation of fictions and dramatic performances, and of acts of imagination that lead to advancement in the sciences. It does not follow that the disposition to engage in pretense is a virtue. You can see why pretense is essential to many valuable things without thinking that it is good, as a general proposition, to take things to be other than they are -- without thinking that there is a virtue of (what we might call) pretensity. (I apologize for the word and will use it only one more time.) All that follows is that some kinds of pretending, in some circumstances, are very valuable.

Those who doubt that loyalty is a virtue do not doubt that loyalty has its place. Ewin (1992, 1993) says that many virtues involve the display of loyalty, but loyalty itself is not a virtue. Baron (1984) says that loyalty is often very valuable, but only when it is of a kind that can be endorsed from an impartial point of view. I say that there are many different kinds of loyalty -- too many and too diverse for loyalty to be construed as a single character trait -- and some of them are virtuous and some of them are not (Keller 2007). These accounts are all consistent with, and the arguments for them often presuppose, Kleinig's claim about how loyalty secures many significant social goods.

I think that much of what Kleinig says is in fact quite friendly to an account on which loyalty is not a virtue, though particular loyalties are valuable under the right circumstances. There are some forms of loyalty, like brand loyalty, whose existence Kleinig acknowledges but that he shows no interest in defending (32). His stories about the nature and value of the various kinds of loyalty are not especially unified. Professional loyalty, for example, turns out to be quite different from friendship and to be valuable for quite different reasons; sticking with a professional community is not much like sticking with a friend. It is not clear, upon reading the whole book, that Kleinig is defending a single psychological or ethical phenomenon.

In any event, Kleinig's overall view of the ethics of loyalty has some significant affinities with the views of writers who deny that loyalty is a virtue. Kleinig says that loyalty is virtue, but a problematic virtue, to be exercised only in the right ways under the right circumstances and within the right restraints. Others say that loyalty is not a virtue, though acting well, under certain circumstances and within certain restraints, can involve acting loyally. There is a difference between these claims, but proponents of each will say that the ethical status of any given act of loyalty depends on the circumstances, and especially on whether acting loyally, in the given case, serves other relevant values and virtues. Proponents of each of the claims will also reject the suggestions that loyalty is at the root of all virtue and that there is a strong presumption in favor of acting loyally.

Kleinig's endorsement of loyalty appears in its sharpest form in the chapter on friendship. The loyalty of good friends, he thinks, is the paradigmatic and purest manifestation of virtuous loyalty, and he is concerned by the possibility that good friendship might sometimes involve moral or epistemic compromise. Might it be true that a good friend will help you move house, but a really good friend will help you move a body (147, 152-169)? Might it be true that a good friend will sometimes believe the best of you, even against the evidence (161-165)?

The discussion of these questions, I should say, is often subtle and perceptive. Kleinig argues that the loyalty of a good friend can indeed be displayed in immoral actions, but when it is, the value of good friendship is, in a way, disrupted (159); and he argues that if there are cases in which standards of good friendship conflict with standards of epistemic responsibility, then they will be rare and will be due to friendly "trust," not "credulity" (163, 280-281).

The problem with the discussion is that it is framed as a repudiation of views on which friendship and loyalty are no good at all: views that nobody, or nobody among those targeted in this chapter, actually holds. Some such views, like the view that friendship is "a corrupting or deeply corruptive relation," are mentioned only in the abstract (155). Other such views -- I point this out sheepishly but still indignantly -- are wrongly attributed to me. Among other things, Kleinig saddles me with the claims that "loyalty is a vice" and that "if loyalty requires that one lie for a friend, it will too easily require that, out of loyalty, one will think it appropriate to lie to a friend" (162, 164). Kleinig does not give references for these claims, and I (let the record show) never make them. I am not accusing Kleinig of deliberate misrepresentation, or of pretensity. I think he just misreads the debate. He treats it as a debate between the champions of loyalty and the opponents of loyalty, and presumes that someone who sees there to be dangers associated with certain kinds of loyalty must be one of loyalty's opponents. But his interlocutors here are not opposed to loyalty, exactly. They just hold views on which loyalty is complicated, sometimes in conflict with ethical and epistemic standards, and valuable only when manifested in the right ways and at the right times -- views, again, not so different from Kleinig's.

I have expressed doubts, some of them self-centered, about Kleinig's presentation of his overall view about the ethics of loyalty. Considered in its own right, though, the view of loyalty as a problematic virtue is important and not implausible, and the approach that Kleinig takes within his account produces strong discussions of the various manifestations of loyalty in many disparate parts of human life. The question of whether loyalty is a virtue is interesting, but how we answer it will depend largely on what we think it takes, speaking generally, for something to qualify as a virtue. In my opinion, the more localized questions -- about family, nationality, friendship, whistle-blowing, patriotism, and so on -- are the really interesting ones, and also the ones on which this book makes its most significant contributions.


I am grateful for helpful comments from Nick Agar, Hilary Beattie, Ramon Das, and John Kleinig.


Baron, M. (1984). The Moral Status of Loyalty. Dubuque, IA: Kendall/Hunt.

Ewin, R. E. (1992). Loyalty and Virtues. Philosophical Quarterly 42: 403-419.

Ewin, R. E. (1993). Loyalties, and Why Loyalty Should Be Ignored. Criminal Justice Ethics 12: 36-42.

Fletcher, G. (1993). Loyalty: An Essay on the Morality of Relationships. New York: Oxford University Press.

Keller, S. (2007). The Limits of Loyalty. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

MacIntyre, A. (1984). Is Patriotism a Virtue? Lawrence: University of Kansas Press.

Oldenquist, A. (1982). Loyalties. Journal of Philosophy 79: 173-193.

Rorty, R. (1997). Justice as a Larger Loyalty. Ethical Perspectives 4: 139-151.

Royce, J. (1908) The Philosophy of Loyalty. New York: MacMillan.