On Mechanism in Hegel's Social and Political Philosophy

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Nathan Ross, On Mechanism in Hegel's Social and Political Philosophy, Routledge, 2008, 158pp., $95.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780415963725.

Reviewed by Michael Morris, Friedrich-Schiller-Universität


Nathan Ross's book examines the role of mechanism -- as a metaphor and a logical category -- in Hegel's political philosophy. He argues that careful attention to Hegel's comments on mechanism should help us (a) to position Hegel's political philosophy within contemporary debates between liberals and communitarians, and (b) to understand Hegel's critique of civil society in relation to his conception of the state. With regard to these objectives, Ross counters the more traditional conception of the Hegelian state as an organic totality, a conception that, in his opinion, both skews Hegel's political philosophy in the direction of contemporary communitarianism and too closely associates it with the views of Romantic thinkers like Novalis and Friedrich Schlegel. In taking this position, Ross continues a marked trend in recent Anglophone scholarship on Hegel. This vigorous trend, one represented with a high degree of sophistication in the works of philosophers like Robert Pippin and Terry Pinkard, seeks to rehabilitate the more individualistic and socially critical elements of Hegel's political philosophy.

This form of rehabilitation seems to be the sine qua non for any sympathetic reconstruction of Hegelian political philosophy as a genuine option within the context of contemporary debates. Even the casual reader of the Philosophy of Right will see the motivation behind this rehabilitation and, at the same time, the challenges that such rehabilitation must face. In at least apparent conflict with theories about the sanctity and autonomy of the individual, Hegel claims that the ethical community -- the highest sphere of social reality -- consists in "powers" or forces to which "individuals are related as accidents to substance."[1] Further, in at least apparent conflict with the kind of social criticism we expect from politically engaged intellectuals, Hegel praises "rectitude" as the "simple conformity" of the individual with "the duties of the station to which he belongs." He then goes on to contrast "rectitude" with "morality," attributing the latter attitude, with its critical and detached standpoint vis-à-vis the established norms of society, to the individual's "craving to be something special."[2]

While Ross does not directly address difficult passages such as these, his general argument against communitarian interpretations of Hegel clearly presents an attempt to assuage concerns about Hegel's apparent anti-individualism. Thus he presents his account of the Hegelian state as a conception that moves beyond "organic" or "communitarian" conceptions that privilege the "cultural unity of the community" over the "rights" and "self interested motives of the individual" (98). While Ross directs the main force of his argument against communitarian interpretations of Hegel, he does not simply transform Hegel into a traditional liberal. Thus he also discusses and largely defends (a) the strong role that Hegel ascribes to the state in regulating the excesses of modern individualism and capitalism, (b) the ways in which Hegel's critique of civil society anticipates certain Marxist concerns, and (c) the unique, non-liberal theory of political representation that Hegel develops. In discussing these themes, Ross shows how many apparently anti-individualistic aspects of Hegel's philosophy actually coincide with some of his most insightful social criticisms. Thus, in presenting Hegel's political philosophy as a kind of third alternative between liberalism and communitarianism, Ross emphasizes both its individualistic and its socially critical aspects.

While this overall interpretation of Hegel's political philosophy follows a general and now relatively well-established trend in the secondary literature, the specific line of argument that Ross presents in favor of this interpretation is unique and, at first glance, paradoxical. Ross seeks to rehabilitate the more individualistic elements of Hegel's philosophy by emphasizing the central role that mechanistic categories and metaphors play in Hegel's account of the state. This may initially seem unpromising, for metaphorical characterizations of society or the state as a machine tend to emphasize the anonymity, alienation, and insignificance of the individuals in the society or state so characterized. In a machine, the form and purpose of the parts are fully determined by some external function or end. In a machine, the parts are worn and ground down by friction and then replaced by new, fully interchangeable ones. By contrast, organic metaphors often suggest complex wholes where the parts are both means and ends, and where the nature of the parts is not simply determined from without, but rather by a complex interplay between their internal features and the larger structures of the organism. Thus, in terms of common metaphorical associations, Ross's proposal may initially strike the reader as somewhat strange.

Ross employs two strategies to associate mechanism with individualism and personal freedom. First, he argues that Hegel's general criticism and modified acceptance of certain mechanistic aspects of society clearly distances his views from the more traditional Romantic opposition between mechanism and organism. The first three chapters focus on this issue. In the first chapter, Ross examines selected works by Novalis and Friedrich Schlegel, focusing on what he sees as the hierarchical and anti-individualistic elements in their organic conception of the ideal society. This discussion then serves as a kind of foil for Ross's account of Hegel's development, as presented in Chapters Two and Three. The first chapter also presents a brief discussion of the positive use of mechanistic metaphors by Enlightenment philosophers such as A.L. Schlötzer and Christian Wolff, and it contrasts the politically reactionary use of organic metaphors, by Novalis and Schlegel, with the distinctly egalitarian and anti-imperialist tendencies that emerge from Herder's conception of society as an organism. Among other things, this chapter at least implicitly demonstrates the difficulty of pinning down the meaning of organism and mechanism as mere metaphors, and thus, advertently or not, it helps to motivate the logical and conceptual discussion of mechanism in Chapter Four.

Next, Ross turns to Hegel's critique of mechanism in his early religious writings (Chapter Two) and in his political works from the Jena period (Chapter Three). Chapter Two argues that, as distinct from the Romantics, who contrast mechanism with sentiment, with non-political aesthetic ideals, or with "organic factors of culture, language, etc.", Hegel contrasts the mechanism of modern society with the political virtues of the Greek polis (33). Unfortunately, Ross does not explain the significance of this claim for his larger argument. This claim does demonstrate a difference between the ideals of the Romantics and the political ideals embraced by the young Hegel. However, it remains unclear how this difference has much relevance with regard to the status of the individual in Hegel's political thought. Chapter Three has a more direct connection with Ross's central argument. Through a discussion of certain key passages in Hegel's System of Ethicality and his Natural Right essay, Ross shows Hegel's growing appreciation for the more mechanistic tendencies that accompany modern economic and legal development. Most convincingly, he shows how modern labor, despite -- or perhaps because of -- its mechanistic division, inaugurates an important kind of socialization and enables a new form of inter-subjective recognition.

In general, Chapter Three establishes a loose series of connections between mechanism, capitalism, the autonomy of individual, self-interest, and civil society. In contrast to our original impression of mechanism as a metaphor, these associations show how a positive appraisal of mechanism may imply, at least for Hegel, a positive appraisal of self-interest, economic freedom, and civil society more generally. Ross sets out some of these associations in the following passage at the end of the chapter:

The distinction between the commercial (what Hegel would later call civil society) and the political in these essays could be described as the difference between mechanism and organism, between formless growth that is driven by a measureless desire to own and consume material goods in ever more refined ways and a principle of development that maintains an intuition of the whole while letting each part pursue its distinct function. (58-9)

Here Ross sets up a connection between commercial or economic development, civil society, and mechanism. He contrasts these terms with the political realm, or the institutions of the state, construed in organic terms. In terms of the associations set out in this passage, Hegel's positive evaluation of mechanism can be equated with his positive evaluation of civil society, a realm of individual freedom and self-interest.

There are two problems with this claim. First, while there may be some loose associations between civil society and mechanism, particularly in economic terms, it seems to be quite a stretch to associate "formless growth that is driven by a measureless desire to own and consume material goods" with "mechanism." Specifically, formless growth doesn't seem to be a feature of mechanism, at least insofar as we construe mechanism, as only seems natural, in relation to machines. Machines don't grow, formlessly or otherwise. Here, again, we see the problem of treating organism and mechanism merely as metaphors, for as such, they are simply too elastic and multivalent. The second problem stems from a seeming inconsistency in Ross's overall account. This passage at least suggests that Hegel construes the state as an organism that incorporates certain mechanistic tendencies or features. Ross makes a similar suggestion in the "Introduction," when he claims that, "Hegel does not oppose the mechanistic and the organic as two anti-nominal models of society … but instead he argues that an organism is 'more organic' when it can posit its mechanical functions as an integral part of itself" (5). This passage strongly suggests that Hegel construes the state or political reality as an organic realm that incorporates mechanistic features. However, in Chapters Four and Five, Ross claims that Hegel conceives the state in terms of the category of "absolute mechanism," which, at best, might be called a kind of proto-organic category.

In Chapter Four, by far the most ambitious and original chapter in the book, Ross examines Hegel's account of mechanism in the Science of Logic. In light of the deeply ambiguous nature of mechanism as a loose metaphor, this chapter makes a crucial contribution to Ross's argument. It also presents, at least within the context of Anglophone Hegel literature, the most original feature of Ross's book -- namely, its insistence that the Science of Logic sheds significant light on Hegel's political philosophy. It is, in fact, the Science of Logic that provides the most convincing basis for Ross's association of mechanism with individualism. In the following passage, quoted by Ross, Hegel provides a conceptual clarification of the nature of mechanism:

This makes up the character of a mechanism that, whatsoever relation pertains between those things that are connected, this relation is a foreign one to them, which does not concern their nature, and even if they are bound together with the appearance of unity, it remains nothing more than a placing together, mixing, assembling.[3]

As this passage and the rest of Hegel's lengthy discussion of mechanism make clear, Hegel does not draw his conception of mechanism from machines, with their external purposiveness and design, but rather he draws it from a mechanistic conception of nature, a conception of physical objects that interact in terms of "Druck und Stoss" -- i.e. pressure and contact. This conception of the universe conceives "unity" as a mere aggregation of independent things, as that which arises from a "placing together, mixing, assembling." Here we can see a clear and convincing connection between mechanism, individualism, and civil society. Communitarians hold that, in a normative and/or explanatory sense, the totality of society is prior to the individuals in the society. In mechanism, by contrast, we see a conception of unity or totality as something that emerges from the aggregation or collection of prior parts.

I would argue, however, that the first part of the passage already suggests the dialectical movement that mechanism undergoes, a movement that is not wholly conducive to Ross's interpretation. In conceiving objects in their primal independence from one another, mechanism treats the relations between objects as completely distinct from their essences. It treats the relation that "pertains between those things that are connected" as a "relation that is a foreign one to them." In other words, these allegedly independent objects are caught up in relations that are fully independent from them. In terms of the physical universe, the categories of mechanism conceive objects merely as distinct chunks of matter. As such, they are independent from one another. However, they are also independent from the motions or forces that explain their relationships. The motion of matter, so construed, only comes from external contact with other objects. So while in one sense the objects are completely distinct, their motion and interaction (i.e. their relations) are always determined from without.

The same dialectical process can be seen at the level of civil society. On the one hand, civil society conceives individuals and their needs and desires as independent from one another. However, because this standpoint fails to take into consideration the forces and laws that shape these desires and that thus govern the interaction between the individuals set in motion by them, it ultimately -- and ironically -- comes to construe individuals as determined from without. Thus at the level of the physical and the social worlds, we see similar dialectical processes in which apparent independence or self-determination reveals itself as dependence and heteronomy.

Because Ross heavily associates civil society with certain aspects of economic development, he almost always focuses on dialectical considerations that move in the opposite direction -- from, for instance, the apparent alienation of mechanized labor to the redemptive social integration that results from it, an integration that enables a kind of self-determination. For the most part, however, I believe that Hegel's dialectical development of civil society moves in the opposite direction, from apparent independence to heteronomy. At the logical level, Ross recognizes this, and thus he presents Hegel's logical discussion of mechanism as a movement from apparent, but illusory, self-determination to a form of self-determination that is genuine -- namely, the self-determination that occurs in absolute mechanism. In contrast to the "billiard ball universe" of pressure and contact, absolute mechanism focuses on the solar system as a series of objects essentially related in terms of the force of attraction.

In both the Science of Logic and the Encyclopedia Logic, Hegel compares the state with absolute mechanism in terms of the structure of the three syllogisms included in each. Expressed in terms of the relation between singular, universal, and particular, these forms include the following: S-U-P, U-S-P, and S-P-U. In some complex sense, Hegel indicates that the government, the individual citizens, and the "needs or external life of the individuals," all relate to one another in a manner analogous to the relation between the sun, the planets, and the orbital bodies around the planets.[4] Unpacking these issues proves remarkably complex, since it requires an account of (a) Hegel's peculiar conception of the solar system as an absolute mechanism, (b) Hegel's conception of the syllogism as a structure of both thought and reality, a structure that explains the relation between the universal, the particular, and the singular, and (c) Hegel's application of these various structures in his account of the state. While Ross only scratches the surface of the issues raised here, his discussion raises valuable questions, questions that should receive more attention from Anglophone scholars working on the Philosophy of Right. It is unfortunate, in this light, that Ross himself did not spend more time working through the issues raised in the final two chapters of his thought provoking book.

[1] Hegel, Georg Wilhelm Friedrich. Philosophy of Right. Oxford University Press, New York. 1967. p. 105.

[2] Ibid. p. 107.

[3] Hegel, Georg Wilhelm Friedrich. Werke. Suhrkamp, Frankfurt. 1986. IV, pp. 409-410. Translation by Ross.

[4] Hegel, Georg Wilhelm Friedrich. Gesammelte Werke. Felix Meier Verlag, Hamburg. 2003. V, p. 274. Translation by Ross.