"On ne naît pas femme: on le devient . . . " The Life of a Sentence

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Bonnie Mann and Martina Ferrari (eds.), "On ne naît pas femme: on le devient . . . " The Life of a Sentence, Oxford University Press, 2017, 362 pp., $74.00, ISBN 9780190608811.

Reviewed by Kathryn Sophia Belle (formerly Kathryn T. Gines), Pennsylvania State University


This book has four sections:"Intellectual History", "History of Scandal", "The Philosophers' Debate", "The Labor of Translation." This robust collection of essays offers an invaluable contribution to scholarship on Beauvoir's most famous text, Le Deuxième Sexe (1949), translated The Second Sex by H.M. Parshley in 1952 (abridged) and by Constance Borde and Sheila Malovany-Chevallier in 2010 (unabridged). More specifically, it examines the philosophical and feminist implications of the text's most famous sentence:"On ne naît pas femme: on le devient". This includes the perceived consequences of translating the sentence with the indefinite article ("One is not born, but rather becomes, a woman") as Parshley does versus translating the sentence without the indefinite article ("One is not born, but rather becomes, woman") as Borde and Malovany-Chevallier do. Rather than offering a detailed discussion of each essay, this review will focus on three thematic debates that stand out in the text as a whole, namely: (1) contentions about translation; (2) social constructivism versus phenomenology and existentialism; and (3) difference, intersectionality, and multiplicity.

The collection's primary value is in bringing together historical and contemporary debates surrounding these and other issues pertaining to The Second Sex (TSS). Its international focus (including discussions of German, Serbo-Croatian, and Finnish translations) is also significant. The main limitation is its focus on mostly white feminist scholarship about Beauvoir, neglecting feminist women of color. Thus, my starting point will be to highlight six decades of engagements by women of color with TSS that are overlooked. After laying this groundwork, the review explores the thematic debates identified above.

Women of color who explicitly take up TSS have remained largely unacknowledged in the secondary literature (including several essays in this collection). To correct this erasure, I call attention to examples of these scholarly contributions published over six decades (1957-2017). Beginning with the second half of the twentieth century, Loraine Hansberry (1957) affirms Beauvoir's analysis of women and critiques the gender politics that prevented adequate attention to the theories advanced in TSS.[1] Angela Davis (1971) cites Beauvoir's accounts of the sexual relations of animals from TSS to problematize sexual assaults against enslaved black women by white male slave masters.[2] Chikwenye Ogunyemi (1985) presents Beauvoir as one example of the different projects of black and white feminism and writing.[3] And Deborah King (1988) critiques Beauvoir's (and other white feminists') use of the race/gender analogy in analyses of patriarchy.[4]

In the twenty-first century, Oyèrónké Oyěwùmí (2000) argues that a problem with Beauvoir and white feminists more generally is their frequent attempts to universalize from their experience in which woman often equals wife -- the subordinated half of a couple in a nuclear family.[5] Mariana Ortega (2006) details Latin American and U.S. Latina Feminist engagements with existentialism and phenomenology through Beauvoir.[6] Kathryn T. Gines (2010, 2014, and 2017) critiques the race/gender analogy as well as comparative and competing conceptions of oppression in TSS.[7] bell hooks (2012) presents Beauvoir as a powerful example of a woman thinker-writer, but also differentiates Beauvoir's tendency to think about female identity as shaped by sex, from her own inclination to analyze female identity as also shaped by gender, race, and class.[8] Kyoo Lee (2012, 2017) analyzes how Beauvoir's "pivotal formulation of femme remains oddly un/re/translatable" in both the Parshley and the Borde and Malovany-Chevallier English translations (while also taking into account Chinese and Korean translations of the famous sentence).[9] Lee (2013) also engages Beauvoir alongside Du Bois as she contemplates the "auto-ethnographical textuality of thinking" as "a source of intersubjective imperatives as well as inspirations."[10] Stephanie Rivera Berruz (2016) argues that Latinas are rendered imperceptible in The Second Sex.[11] For Berruz, "At stake in this discussion is whose oppression and lived experiences can be named and identified as meaningful."[12] And Patricia Hill Collins (2017) examines "Beauvoir's approach to women's oppression as a form of non-freedom, paying special attention to the way she develops her arguments about oppression and freedom using analogical thinking about race and gender."[13]

The book provides insights about the egregious problems with Parshley's translation -- offering helpful context for the mixed reception of Borde and Malovany-Chevallier's translation. Early critiques of Parshley's translation are reprinted here, including Margaret A. Simons' "The Silencing of Simone de Beauvoir: Guess What's Missing from The Second Sex" and Toril Moi's "While We Wait: The English Translation of The Second Sex." Simons underscores the sexism functioning in Parshley's abridged translation, meticulously exposing the deletions from sections on women's history in particular, and highlighting Parshely's philosophical misinterpretations (60, 64). Likewise, Moi argues that Parshley's cuts and omissions coupled with his philosophical incompetence have been "damaging to Beauvoir's intellectual reputation in particular and to the reputation of feminist philosophy in general" (72).

There are debates about the shortcomings and improvements of the Borde and Molovany-Chevallier translation. In "The Adultress Wife," Moi acknowledges that Borde and Malovany-Chevallier's translation is an improvement over Parshley's because it is unabridged and there is more consistency in the philosophical vocabulary (113). But she also notes, "The obsessive literalism and countless errors make it no more reliable, and far less readable than Parshley" (113). Nancy Bauer is also critical of Borde and Molovany-Chevallier in "Simone de Beauvoir: The Second Sex, Review of the New Translation" where she points to errors as well as the long sentences and literalism "that hampers the flow of Beauvoir's prose and obfuscates its meaning" (115, 118, 121).

Supportive readers of the Borde and Molovany-Chevallier translation include Meryl Altman and Bonnie Mann. In "The Grand Rectification: The Second Sex" Altman asserts that the translators, ". . . have sometimes made things unnecessarily hard for themselves (and for readers). But their systematic choices were made with integrity and are explained clearly in an honest way" (128). Likewise, Mann, in "Beauvoir Against Objectivism: The Operation of the Norm in Beauvoir and Butler," states:

They sought to honor the history of feminist thought since Beauvoir, which had been determined to name and uncover the constitution of the woman-subject in and through relations of power and to honor Beauvoir's own concern with the operations of 'the eternal feminine' as the insidious justification of power. (51)

Of course, Borde and Malovany-Chevallier defend their translation choices in "The Life of a Sentence: Translation as a Lived Experience."

Several essays take up translation theory more generally -- including "foreignization" versus "domestication" (described by Lawrence Venuti as imperialist violence) debates. Examples include: Anna-Lisa Baumeister's, "French Women Become, German Women Are Made?: Simone de Beauvoir, Alice Schwarzer, Translation and Quotation"; Anna Bogić's, "Becoming Woman: Simone de Beauvoir and Drugi pol in Socialist Yugoslavia"; and Erika Ruonakoski's, "Retranslating The Second Sex into Finnish: Choices, Practices, and Ideas." Marybeth Timmerman, in "Challenges in Translating Beauvoir" explains, "By avoiding modernization, we used a foreignization technique . . . On the other hand, there were many times that we domesticated the texts, such as changing Beauvoir's punctuation to make it easier for English-speaking readers to follow her train of thought" (294, emphasis added).

I especially appreciated Ruonakoski's essay because she explicitly names passages in TSS that are outdated and offensive. She states, "we did not modify Beauvoir's outdated concepts such as 'hermaphridite' (hermaphrodite) . . . or 'négresses' (negro women) to fit the ideals of political correctness of our days."[14] She adds, "In point in fact, making some modernizing word choices would not have been enough to make the translation unoffending. Among other things, Beauvoir does not hesitate to call the Muslim woman 'a kind of slave' (2010, 92; une sorte d'esclave, 2008b, 141)" (346).[15] Critiquing Beauvoir's overgeneralizations in TSS, Ruonakoski is clear: "even if she did not intend to be arrogant, she certainly made sweeping -- and from today's perspective deeply problematic -- generalizations about numerous ethnic groups" (346).

Another theme in the collection is the sex/gender distinction and social constructivism versus existentialism phenomenology.[16] These themes overlap with the issue of translation and the inclusion of the indefinite article in Parshley's translation versus the exclusion of the indefinite article in Borde and Malovany-Chevallier's translation. For some, at stake in the inclusion/exclusion of the indefinite article is whether we read Beauvoir as a social constructivist or an existential phenomenologist. Karen Offen ("Before Beauvoir, Before Butler: 'Gender' in France and the Angelo" American World") reads Beauvoir as a social constructivist. She explains, "by setting this sentence, and Beauvoir's work more broadly, in the context of French historical understandings of 'gender,' I would hope to demonstrate that the sentence should be read in terms of social construction" (13). Bogić examines social constructivist readings of Beauvoir beyond the USA and France, asserting, "The notion that women's roles and their 'essence' are always already socially constructed and manufactured has shown itself to be a powerful statement capable of sparking desire for deep change in societies far removed from Beauvoir's France of the 1940s" (327).

Essays emphasizing existentialism and phenomenology include the aforementioned works by Simons and Moi.[17] Megan M. Burke ("Becoming A Woman: Reading Beauvoir's Response to the Woman Question") supports phenomenological readings and resists social constructivist readings of the TSS as arguing for a sex/gender distinction (e.g. Judith Butler). Burke asserts:

I think the exclusion of the indefinite article, the a, in 'the famous sentence' fails to read Beauvoir as giving a phenomenological account of feminine existence . . . [W]e come to read Beauvoir as a social constructivist. This not only makes it difficult for readers to grasp Beauvoir's account of feminize existence as a phenomenological one, but it also conceals the fruitfulness of her phenomenological approach. (161)

Carmen Lopez Sáenz reads TSS phenomenologically in "The Phenomenal Body Is Not Born; It Comes to Be a Body-Subject" where she states, "It is the contention of this contribution that if we study the work of Beauvoir within the phenomenological framework of the lived body, we will understand that she goes much further that the mere distinction between given natural sex and socially constructed gender" (175).

Exploring these debates in German translations of TSS, Baumeister problematizes Alice Schwarzer's translation because it emphasizes a social constructivist rather than a phenomenological account of woman. Ruonakoski reads TSS phenomenologically, noting:

We were certainly heavily influenced by Heinämaa's interpretation of The Second Sex, especially in the following issues: that the phenomenological notion of the lived body was one of Beauvoir's most crucial starting points, and that explaining Beauvoir's conception of embodiment in terms of the sex-gender distinction does not do it justice (e.g. Heinämaa 1996: 1997). (338)

Mann embraces the tensions and ambiguities of the social constructionist readings alongside phenomenological readings (40-41) and poststructuralist perspectives (44). In "The Floating 'a,'" Debra Bergoffen also offers ambiguity as an alternative to the social constructivism versus existential phenomenology binary. She explains:

Posing the translation question as an either/or choice . . . unreflectively (re) enforces the binary habits of thought that Beauvoir found questionable . . . we need to let the 'a' float between these English translations such that in speaking to, rather than against each other they are read as marking the phenomenological ambiguity and political undecidability of (a) woman -- the subject of The Second Sex and of this particular sentence. (143)

To be sure, questions concerning feminism and difference, intersectionality, and multiplicity, as well as critiques and defenses of Beauvoir along these lines, emerge in several of the essays. For example, in "Woman Does Not Become Her," Janine Jones gestures at the question of women and difference by underscoring the specificity of woman in TSS. Jones posits, "We might say, on Beauvoir's behalf, that her concept of WOMAN is indexed to a very specific type of situation only, best characterized by the lived experiences of white, Western, bourgeois, heterosexual, cis women" (206). In some of the essays, when pertinent scholarship on these issues is cited, it is not productively engaged. And in others, pertinent scholarship on these issues is not even cited.

Bergoffen names intersectionality, noting, "those critiquing Beauvoir's inattention to the intersectionality of being/becoming a woman may be heard as arguing for the ways that the Parshley translation opens The Second Sex to the possibilities of addressing these issues" (157). Situating diverse women's experiences within the context of the translation debates, Bergoffen suggests:

We need to be open to the idea that either one of the English translations by itself leads to a dead end: the new translation by erasing the diversity of women and/or negating their capacity for liberation, the older translation by losing sight of the way that the material realities produced by the myth of woman can subvert the emergence of singular women and haunt the lives of those women whose existence challenges the myth. (157)

Bergoffen cites Patricia Hill Collins (Black Feminist Thought, 1991), bell hooks (Feminist Theory: From Margin to Center, 1984), and Audre Lorde (Zami; Sister Outsider; and Undersong, 1993) on these issues. Unfortunately, there is no substantive engagement with their theories in her chapter.

Megan M. Burke in "Becoming A Woman: Reading Beauvoir's Response to the Woman Question" cites and engages white women's racial critiques of TSS by Elizabeth Spelman and Margaret Simons. She summarizes their critiques of Beauvoir in this way:

For Simons and Spelman, then, asking the woman question requires race privilege; it is only a white woman in her race privilege that can ask about being 'a' woman. Other women always qualify and account for their womanness in relation to racial difference. From this perspective, the lack of analysis of race in The Second Sex means that we have to qualify Beauvoir's account of becoming woman as an account of whiteness. From this reading, Beauvoir overly generalizes, obscures difference, and assumes that all women share a 'golden nugget of womanness' because she has the white privilege to do so (Spelman 1988, 159). (171)

This quick rendition of Spelman and Simons misses the point. It is not the case that asking the woman question requires race privilege. But asking the woman question from the perspective of white middle-class women's situation and assuming that this particular situation is representative of other women who are differently situated does entail race privilege (not to mention class and other forms of privilege). The issue is not simply that an analysis of race is absent in the TSS. In fact, race is present in the TSS, but often problematically. Unfortunately, Burke does not cite or engage the critiques of women of color. Despite Burke's apologetics, neither reading Beauvoir phenomenologically nor including/excluding the "a" before "woman" in the English translation is enough to address these criticisms by feminist writers, both white and women of color.[18]

Lopez Sáenz talks about "difference" and "multiplicity" in lived experiences. Merleau-Ponty is her interlocutor and she asserts, "If she [Beauvoir] had only adopted this [Merleau-Ponty's] perspective, she would not have described the multiplicity of experiences lived by women as a collective " (192). Nevertheless, "Without a doubt, Beauvoir has described women's different lived experiences of the body over time with much more care than Merleau-Ponty" (192). The references to "multiplicity" warrant some engagement with Latina feminist philosophers' important scholarship on this concept. For example, María Lugones examines what she describes as the "urge to control multiplicity" of people and of things and "the reduction of multiplicity to unity."[19] Lugones discloses, "I realize that separation into clean, tidy things and beings is not possible for me because it would be the death of myself as multiplicitous and a death of community with my own."[20]

More recently, Mariana Ortega's account of the multiplicitous self is informed by intersectionality, the phenomenologies of women of color, and an explicitly ontological and existential analysis.[21] Ortega argues, "Recognition of the multiplicity of the self requires an understanding of the complex ways in which the self's various social identities intersect or intermesh, recognizing the way different axes of oppression are intertwined, and considering the self's flexibility."[22] Lopez Sáenz notes, "we might say that feminist phenomenology is not made, but rather is reactivated every time that we inquire from our plural lived experiences in search of meaning." (194) I would add that feminist phenomenology is also reactivated when we engage the feminisms and philosophies of women of color.

Jennifer McWeeny's "The Second Sex of Consciousness: A New Temporality and Ontology for Beauvoir's 'Becoming a Woman'" focuses on prereflective consciousness as a space for acknowledging difference -- including differently lived bodies resulting in different perspectives (240).[23] Although She puts Beauvoir in productive conversation with Sartre and Merleau-Ponty, she does not do so with W.E.B. Du Bois. That is, McWeeny cites Du Bois (along with Fanon, Lugones, Simons, Wright, Ortega, Barvosa, Heidegger, James, Gordon, and others), but does not offer the same care and framing of Du Bois's double consciousness as she does with other concepts in Sartre and Merleau-Ponty -- even while she is presenting double consciousness as an alternative to their approaches. Despite this shortcoming, McWeeny productively explores Latina feminist contributions to double consciousness and multiplicity, noting:

Contemporary feminists like María Lugones and Gloria Anzaldúa take this kind of approach to ontological plurality. Rather than view double-consciousness as a sign of fragmentation that must return to an original oneness in order to be liberated, they see in multiplicity unparalleled possibilities for knowledge, resistance, creativity, and coalition. (264)

To conclude, this book is worth reading cover to cover, but also alongside other key texts outlined in the opening and footnotes of this review.

[1]Loraine Hansberry, "Simone de Beauvoir and The Second Sex: An American Commentary" (1957) in Words of Fire: An Anthology of African American Feminist Thought (Ed. Beverly Guy Sheftall. The New Press, 1995).

[2] Angela Davis, "Reflections on the Black Woman's Role in the Community of Slaves" in The Black Scholar, Vol. 3, No. 4, The Black Woman (December 1971), pages 2-15.

[3] Chikwenye Ogunyemi, "Womanism: The Dynamics of the Contemporary Black Female Novel in English" in SIGNS, Vol. 11, No. 1, Autum,1985, pages 63-80.

[4] Deborah King's "Multiple Jeopardy, Multiple Consciousness: The Context of a Black Feminist Ideology" in SIGNS, Vol. 14, No. 1, Autumn 1988, pages 42-72.

[5] Oyèrónké Oyěwùmí, "Family Bonds/Conceptual Binds: African Notes on Feminist Epistemologies" in SIGNS, Vol. 25, No. 4, Feminisms at a Millennium (Summer 2000), pages 1093-1098.

[6] Mariana Ortega "Phenomenological Encuentros: Existential Phenomenology and Latin American and U.S. Latina Feminism" in Radical Philosophy Review, Vol. 9, No.1, 2006 pages 45-64.

[7] Kathryn T. Gines, "Sartre, Beauvoir, and the Race/Gender Analogy: A Case for Black Feminist Philosophy" in Convergences: Black Feminism and Continental Philosophy, pages 35-51. Eds. Maria Davidson, Kathryn T. Gines, Donna Dale Marcano. (SUNY, 2010); "Comparative and Competing Frameworks of Oppression in Simone de Beauvoir's The Second Sex" in Graduate Faculty Philosophy Journal. Volume 35, Numbers 1-2, 2014, pages 251-273; and "Simone de Beauvoir and the Race/Gender Analogy Revisited" in Blackwell Companion to Beauvoir (Eds. Nancy Bauer and Laura Hengehold. Wiley-Blackwell, 2017).

[8] bell hooks, "True Philosophers: Beauvoir and bell" in Simone de Beauvoir in Western Thought: Plato to Butler, Eds. Shannon M. Mussett and William S. Wilkerson, SUNY Press, 2012.

[9] Kyoo Lee, "Should My Bum Look Bigger in This? -- Re-Dressing the Beauvoirian Femme" in Women's Studies Quarterly, Vol. 41, No. ½, Spring/Summer 2012, pages 184-193. See also Lee, "Second Languaging The Second Sex, Its Conceptual Genius: A Translingual Contemporazation of 'On ne naît pas femme: on le devient" in Blackwell Companion to Beauvoir (Eds. Nancy Bauer and Laura Hengehold. Wiley-Blackwell, 2017).

[10] Kyoo Lee, "Why Asian Female Stereotypes Matter to All: Beyond Black and White, East and West" in Critical Philosophy of Race, Vol.1, Issue 1, 2013, pages 86-103, 88.

[11] Stephanie Rivera Berruz "At the Crossroads: Latina Identity and Simone de Beauvoir's The Second Sex" in Hypatia, Vol. 31, Issue 2, 2016, pages 319-333.

[12] Berruz 2016, 323.

[13] Patricia Hill Collins, "Simone de Beauvoir, Woman's Oppression and Existential Freedom" in Blackwell Companion to Beauvoir (Eds. Nancy Bauer and Laura Hengehold. Wiley-Blackwell, 2017).

[14] Ruonakoski adds, "In this sense our translation came out less domesticated that that of Borde's and Malovany-Chevallier's in which 'négresses' is rendered as 'African women.' (2010, 178)" (346).

[15] Alia Al-Saji critiques Beauvoir's representations of Muslim and Arab women (in The Second Sex and Ethics of Ambiguity) in "Material Life: Bergsonian Tendencies in Simone de Beauvoir's Philosophy" in Differences: Rereading Beauvoir and Irigary (Eds. Emily Anne Parker and Anne can Leeuwen. Oxford University Press, 2018).

[16] The editors and contributors note that Beauvoir does not explicitly offer a sex/gender distinction in TSS. Altman explains, "While Beauvoir's work helped second-wave feminism see the difference between 'natural' sex' and socially constructed gender, she herself never formulates the distinction in those terms." (128)

[17] Moi underscores how English translations contribute to misunderstanding about existentialist vocabulary in TSS, but she also notes that TSS provides the "insight that women are not born but made, that every society has constructed a vast material, cultural, and ideological apparatus dedicated to the fabrication of femininity" -- an insight that contributes to "the foundation of modern feminism." (105).

[18] More recent white feminist racial critiques of Beauvoir (not cited by Burke) include: Sabine Broeck, "Re-reading de Beauvoir 'after race': Woman-as-slave revisited," in International Journal of Francophone Studies, Vol. 14, No. 1-2, 2011; and Penelope Deutscher. The Philosophy of Simone de Beauvoir: Ambiguity, Conversion, Resistance. (Cambridge University Press, 2008). Important racial critiques of Beauvoir from women of color feminists are outlined in the opening section of this review (and in footnotes 1-15).

[19] María Lugones, "Purity, Impurity, and Separation" in SIGNS, Vol. 19, No. 2, Winter 1994, pages 458-479, 458 and 464. Hereafter, PIS.

[20] PIS, 469. See also, María Lugones, : "Multiculturalismo radical y feminismos de mujeres de color" in Revista internacional de filosofia politica, Vol. 25, No. 7, 2005, pages 61-75. And "Radical Multiculturalism and Women of Color Feminisms" in Journal for Cultural and Religious Theory, Decoloniality and Crisis, Vol. 13, No. 1, Winter 2014, pages 68-80.

[21] Mariana Ortega, In-Between: Latina Feminist Phenomenology, Multiplicity, and the Self (SUNY Press, 2016).

[22] Ortega 2016, 71.

[23] McWeeny argues, "Just as Beauvoir considers how one becomes a woman, we could also ask, for example, how one becomes black, brown, colonized, lower-class, queer, transgender, or disabled by looking at the features of prereflective consciousness and self-body relation that emerge as a common ground in these respective styles of existence" (263).