On Oligarchy: Ancient Lessons for Global Politics

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David Tabachnick and Toivo Koivukoski (eds.), On Oligarchy: Ancient Lessons for Global Politics, University of Toronto Press, 2011, 240pp., $27.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781442609860.

Reviewed by Matthew Simonton, University of California, Berkeley


David Tabachnick and Toivo Koivukoski state in the preface to this thought-provoking volume that their aim was to "draw lessons for today's global politics by returning to the thoughtful and articulate descriptions of oligarchy found in . . . ancient texts." Judged in terms of that goal the book is a success. It brings together eleven American and Canadian scholars, mostly political theorists and philosophers but also historians and classicists, in order to assess contemporary politics through the lens of classical political thought. Aristotle features most prominently among the sources, but Plato, Thucydides, Cicero, and some lesser-known but welcome figures (Antiphon the sophist, the Attic orators) also make appearances.

As the editors note, the topic under discussion, oligarchy, has largely been neglected by modern scholars, despite its good classical pedigree and its apparent applicability to our present political situation. (An exception, probably arriving too late to catch their attention, is Jeffrey A. Winters' Oligarchy [Cambridge 2011]; its lack of a de rigueur academic subtitle indicates how open the subject remains to detailed study.) Yet just as interesting as the textual exegesis and comparison of ancient with modern on display here is the variety of prescriptions and viewpoints offered. The differing responses of the contributors make clear that the degree to which oligarchy constitutes a problem for modern politics depends upon how one defines oligarchy, whether one thinks ancient solutions can be or have been transcended by modern ones, and what one believes the scope and limits of politics should be. These points of debate emerge not only from the arguments themselves but from the feeling of dialogue that pervades the contributors' pieces: they have clearly read one another's essays and respond in their own way where appropriate. The result is a collection that reads like an organic discussion rather than a random assemblage. I will single out several particularly strong voices in the conversation before assessing the work overall.

In "Aristotle and American Oligarchy: A Study in Political Influence," Jeremy S. Neill, like many of the contributors, first lays out Aristotle's definition and analysis of oligarchy in the Politics before applying his insights to the American situation. Aristotle recognized that oligarchy was based not only on numbers and wealth, but on an underlying political ideology, with a unique understanding of justice, worth, and merit. Whereas democrats believed that the equal free status of every adult male citizen of the ancient polis justified equal political power, oligarchs based their more exclusive political privileges on the notion that unequal wealth entailed inequality in the public sphere as well. Again, like other contributors, Neill observes that for Aristotle, these democratic and oligarchic constitutions differed not only in their formal institutions but in their way of life, their deep-seated "national character."

All of this might hinder us from adopting an Aristotelian viewpoint from which to judge modern nation-states, where the legitimacy of democracy is universally accepted and where pluralistic liberalism prevents governments from promoting a single, thoroughgoing conception of the good life. Yet Neill succeeds in showing that Aristotle's characterization of oligarchy as a deviant form of government, where the rulers work for their own private advancement rather than the public good, can help us to identify and criticize informal elements of oligarchy within modern democracies. He focuses on the expense involved in political campaigning, the power of lobbyists and special interests, and the influence of multinational corporations and other supra-state entities. Such trends can legitimately be said to run afoul of Aristotle's conception of good government because "they are causing the system to fail to function as the democracy that it purports to be" (37). According to Neill, Aristotle, as a pragmatic realist and student of history, would also have disapproved of modern democracy's tendency to undermine its own stability through such negative consequences as favoritism towards the rich and large-scale inequality. Yet it is unclear whether the American political system is actually headed towards fundamental instability.

Almost as a reply to Neill, Jeffrey Sikkenga argues in "Overcoming Oligarchy: Republicanism and the Right to Property in The Federalist" that the U.S. Constitution transcends the ancient conflict between democracy and oligarchy by promoting the peaceful acquisition of private property over public honor and rent-seeking. Through a historical narrative redolent of the influential argument of Benjamin Constant, Sikkenga shows that the high-stakes violence of the Greek polis, encouraged by small size and military insecurity, has given way to modern commercial nation-states that foster the bourgeois virtues of hard work, thrift, and investment. The Constitution contributes to this historical shift both at the institutional level, by balancing different factions and interests against one another through divided government, and in a more abstract sense, by imbuing the entire citizenry, rich and poor, with the idea that they all equally have the opportunity to advance through a system of secure property rights. (Waller R. Newell in his contribution also points to this shared ideology as a glue-like element in the American republic; Leah Bradshaw, on the other hand, argues that the Federalists, inspired by Locke, really just justify greed and elevate oligarchy over democracy.)

There are a few potential problems here, however. First, recent work has shown that Classical Athens was working towards a balance of secure property rights and the rule of law, one result of which was (modest) economic growth. Yet if Athens achieved this "Goldilocks zone" of productive institutional alignment while remaining a direct democracy, the supposed need for more oligarchic elements within the U.S. Constitution lessens. Furthermore, by ending his discussion with the achievement of The Federalist in the 18th century, Sikkenga overlooks the vast changes in American society that have since taken place thanks to industrialization and the New Deal. Americans now largely accept the legitimacy of a modern welfare state supported by progressive taxation. However, if the wealthy have found ways to hide their money and dismantle social programs, then we are back at the oligarchic impasse that Neill diagnoses.

Finally, in an impassioned and iconoclastic essay that will likely intrigue many but convince few, Peter Simpson takes philosophical aim at what he considers a corrupt, debauched, and thoroughly oligarchic modern political system. Employing his usual creativity -- he once "discovered" an entire "Regime of the Americans," in ancient Greek, attributed to Aristotle -- Simpson first reconstructs Aristotle's picture of oligarchy essentially by extension. He takes up Aristotle's suggestion to use a passage about democracy from Politics Book 6 to arrive at an equivalent outline of oligarchy by reversing all of the elements of democracy within it. Thus the statement that democracies "choose all of the offices from everyone" implies that oligarchies "choose all of the offices from some," and so on. Having reconstituted Aristotle's list of oligarchic characteristics in this fashion, he then shows how the American political system exhibits them all: In order to run for political office, one must be rich, or court the rich; the same people consistently run for office and win, and political dynasties proliferate; and, more fundamentally, there is no popular assembly in which the people can directly express their will. For Simpson, these shortcomings do not simply represent innocent mistakes or lapses in judgment; they have been purposefully implemented through deceitful claims, what he calls "sophistries." Not only that, but Aristotle recognized these tricks long ago, and even identified our particular form of government: "demagogic oligarchy." "We should, then, according to Aristotle," says Simpson, "pride ourselves, if pride be the right word, not on discovering universal democracy but on discovering universal sophistry" (82).

There is nothing inherently unconvincing about Simpson's judgment upon modernity, and one can applaud him for both the rigor and the brio with which he carries out his Aristotelian analysis. However, in his account of how we have arrived at this situation, and in his proposed solutions, he is less coherent. For Simpson, the most nefarious tendency of the modern world has been centralization, the amassing of great power in the hands of the national state. Citing Tocqueville's writings on the ancien régime in France, he shows that this process was already underway before the Revolution, in the time of the Bourbon monarchs. In England a similar trajectory unfurled as the state seized church lands and dissolved traditional feudal relationships. In a section full of romantic and reactionary nostalgia, Simpson conjures up an idyllic image of the medieval town, emphasizing its manifold individual customs and social hierarchies. While inequality was entrenched and hereditary, he suggests, it was at least tied to a specific local tradition and tacitly agreed upon by a small community of religious believers. Twenty-first century political equality, by contrast, is stretched so thin among so dull and uniform a population as to be rendered worthless.

One is likely to be distracted by the extreme unfamiliarity of Simpson's political position, but this should not prevent us from seeing that there are theoretical problems with his account, even on its own terms. In particular, Simpson recognizes that centralization can take place under both autocratic regimes, such as the French absolutist monarchy, and modern liberal democracies. It is therefore unclear why a shift from an unaccountable sovereign to nominal control by a universally enfranchised electorate does not count as at least a partial victory for the majority of the population. Simpson speaks as though modern democratic (he would say "oligarchic") politicians pander to the worst excesses of the demos, but this does not make the greater material benefits that therefore flow to the populace any less real. Liberal democracies are not a one-way street of power: elections, despite being imperfect tools of accountability, pressure elites to keep their promises to the people or else get replaced by more responsive "oligarchs." The practical alternative to this scenario in the modern world is not feudalism but dictatorship, and dictators have a much poorer track record of respecting the will of the majority. There are thus at least two axes on the "graph" we are considering, "centralization/decentralization" and "democracy/dictatorship." If we have to choose some combination, and if centralization cannot be reversed, then centralized democracy is the least bad option -- and this is to say nothing of the ways we might deepen contemporary democratic practice.

The mention of possible solutions to the problem of oligarchy brings me to my conclusion. As stated before, the contributors offer differing proposals. Some, like Newell and Sikkenga, seem to believe that democratic institutions and values are resilient enough to resist an oligarchic takeover of the political system. Others recommend either a return to traditional civic education (Geoffrey Kellow, and to a lesser extent Steven C. Skultety), or, as we have seen, an even more dramatic turning back of the clock, to pre-modern social conditions (Simpson). Leah Bradshaw adopts a more material approach: at the conclusion of her comparison of the ancients with Locke, she seems to advocate a redistribution of property, in order not so much to create a classless society as to stave off political instability. Although this brief sketch cannot do the arguments full justice, it should be clear that none of them is particularly innovative in its prescriptions. There is little or no attempt to improve upon or transcend the version of democracy we employ now.

Of course, radical schemes to surpass liberal democracy in the twentieth century were often either hopelessly naïve or wantonly destructive, yet it is neither idealistic nor reckless to point out that citizens across the world are already experimenting with more participatory forms of democracy. See, for instance, the political scientist James Fishkin's Deliberative Poll, which creates a setting quite similar to the ancient Athenian Council of 500; participatory budgeting schemes, in places as distant and as different as Porto Alegre, Brazil, and Vallejo, California; and the U.S. Tea Party and Occupy movements, which in their different ways have both injected a populist element into American politics. It would have been helpful to have an entry that placed these and other global movements in historical perspective, especially since the editors mention the fact that oligarchic tendencies have recently given rise to "planetary protest." Instead, the contributors' focus is largely Anglo-American, and the U.S. Constitution is taken to be the quintessential document of modern democracy. Yet just as there is more to ancient oligarchy than Aristotle has to say (as Laurie M. Johnson Bagby, Toivo Koivukoski, and Craig Cooper admirably show), so American liberal democracy might not be the "end of history." A greater emphasis on comparative history and politics would therefore have further enlivened this volume. As it is, it still provides an exemplary case of bringing ancient wisdom to bear on a pressing modern issue.