On Patience: Reclaiming a Foundational Virtue

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Matthew Pianalto, On Patience: Reclaiming a Foundational Virtue, Lexington Books, 2016, 145pp., $80.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781498528207.

Reviewed by Shirong Luo, Simmons College


"Time and tide wait for no man"; "Life is short"; "Things may come to those who wait, but only the things left by those who hustle" (a remark attributed to Abraham Lincoln). These pithy adages seem to conspire against the humble virtue of patience. However, Matthew Pianalto eloquently defends the virtue of patience against a variety of challenges, worries, and misunderstandings by arguing that patience is not a simple virtue of waiting, but a multifaceted disposition supporting and being supported by a network of virtues. It turns out that patience, properly construed, plays a fundamental role in the pursuit of human flourishing.

Though a slender volume, Pianalto's On Patience has filled a large gap in contemporary discussion of virtue ethics, lifted the notion of patience from its philosophical obscurity, and called attention to the importance of patience as a foundational virtue. For a long time, the concept of patience has been given a short shrift in philosophical discussions, so it is delightful and refreshing to see the first book-length philosophical examination of the topic.

In his book, Pianalto has defended the claims that patience is a multidimensional virtue and that there can be no such a thing as too much patience. He has also shed light on Gregory the Great's dictum that "patience is the root and guardian of all virtues" (xiii). Put in a nutshell, the author's overarching thesis may be succinctly summarized as "patience is a foundational virtue," as the title of his book seems to imply. His main strategy is to let the broad notion of patience -- patience as a multi-dimensional virtue -- play a pivotal role throughout the book.

This book consists of seven chapters. In the first, the author highlights the importance of patience by drawing on such writers as Kafka and Nietzsche. For Plato and Aristotle, there are four cardinal virtues -- wisdom, justice, temperance, and courage and by implication four cardinal vices -- ignorance, injustice, intemperance, and cowardice. But Kafka reduces cardinal vices to only one: impatience. How detrimental is impatience? Perhaps nothing in the theological portrayal of human history is more disastrous than the Fall and Kafka's attributing it to impatience on the part of the first couple of the human race certainly puts a spotlight on this vice and by implication on the virtue of patience. According to Pianalto, "Kafka is talking about a specifically Christian conception of redemption. Interpreted more broadly, he is talking about living well" (3). But this explanation leaves a crucial question unanswered because the common understanding of the Fall is that Adam and Eve were forced into exile due to their disobedience. Then the question is how impatience is related to disobedience or patience to obedience.

In the second chapter, Pianalto argues that patience is not a one-dimensional virtue, but rather a multifaceted one. As such patience includes self-possessed waiting, uncomplaining endurance, forbearance and tolerance, constancy and perseverance. This broad notion of patience has certain theoretical advantages and plays a crucial role in responding to critics and rectifying misunderstandings, but it also leads to some questions. It seems that all the aspects of patience -- endurance, forbearance, tolerance, constancy and perseverance -- are virtues in their own rights. Aquinas, for example, argues that perseverance is a virtue. So the question is whether patience is a simple virtue or a compound virtue or whether it is a first-order virtue or a second-order virtue. In some places, Pianalto seems to see the way patience relates to other virtues as the genus-species relationship. For instance, endurance (or forbearance, etc.) is a type of patience (xii). In other places, he treats their relationship as parts to a whole (patience). He identifies the aspects of patience as "this whole, interrelated cluster of capacities -- calm waiting, endurance, tolerance, and perseverance -- as parts of patience, none of which is fully separable from the others" (47). If so, then patience can emerge as a result of developing all the constituent virtues subsumed under it.

The third chapter is where Pianalto defines patience. After critically comparing Joseph Kupfer and Eamonn Callan's definitions, he builds his own definition on Callan's whose definition of patience is much broader than Kupfer's. He offers the three definitions with increasing sophistication and complexity:

(P1) Patience is the disposition to accept unavoidable and wisely assumed burdens (51);

(P2) Patience is the disposition to accept unavoidable burdens as well as those avoidable burdens that one judges it wise to accept (53);

(P3) Patience is the disposition to accept unavoidable burdens as well as those avoidable burdens that one can reasonably judge it to be wise to accept (54).

What is unclear here is how these definitions of patience are related to the broad conception of patience discussed in the preceding chapter.

The fourth chapter focuses on making sense of Gregory the Great's thesis that "patience is the root and guardian of all the virtues". Presumably Pianalto's thesis that patience is a "foundational virtue" comes from Gregory's root metaphor. Pianalto explains that patience plays a crucial role in ethical development, anchoring and nourishing other virtues (57). Other virtues may be assumed to include justice, courage, benevolence, wisdom, etc. But if patience is defined as the disposition to accept burdens that one can judge it to be wise to accept, then practical wisdom -- an intellectual virtue -- seems to be more basic than patience, as it is required to decide whether to accept burdens or not.

Gregory's guardian metaphor means that patience retains a fundamental place in the virtuous life even after one has developed other virtues (57). Pianalto selects three major virtues -- love, courage, and wisdom -- to argue that there is a close connection between them and patience. His argument relies on the broad rather than narrow conception of patience: "with the broad account of patience . . . in hand, we are in a better position to understand what Gregory had in mind" (57). Pianalto argues that "When we wait, forbear, endure, or persevere with patience, we maintain an attitude of acceptance toward the various burdens thrust upon us by a situation" (57). It seems that the latter quotation may lead to confusion or misunderstanding of the broad conception of patience. This is because on the one hand, as Pianalto notes, there are multiple aspects to the virtue of patience, namely self-possessed waiting, forbearance, endurance, tolerance, and perseverance, but on the other hand we can wait with patience, forbear with patience or persevere with patience.

The question is: when we persevere (endure, tolerate or forebear) with patience, are we exercising one virtue or two? If two, how are they related to each other? Pianalto states in the Preface, "in each section I explore the ideas of one or more thinkers from various philosophical or religious traditions who emphasize that particular aspect or type of patience" (xii). If there are different types of patience, then the concept of patience itself seems to be a second-order concept. It follows that when we exercise perseverance, we exercise patience. It would be redundant to say that we exercise perseverance with patience because perseverance is (a type of) patience. A further question is how these different types of patience differ from one another.

In the fifth chapter, Pianalto discusses two contrasting views on patience and anger. What is the relationship between anger and patience? Is patience always antithetical to anger? Following Seneca, and utilizing the broad conception of patience, he maintains:

one must always be patient in situations that typically provoke anger . . . Taking one's time involves patience in all of its different aspects: for it involves calmly waiting for the right moment to act . . . enduring the pain, discomfort, or inconvenience that has been caused, and exercising forbearance . . . In exercising these patient capacities, the one who takes her time is thereby able to persevere in her commitment to other ideals. (98)

Aristotle argues that there can be such a thing as virtuous anger, defined as being "angry at the right things and toward the right person, and also in the right way, at the right time and for the right length of time" (84).

For Aristotle, virtuous anger or righteous indignation is anger kept under rational control. However, the Stoic philosopher Seneca denies there can be such a thing as controllable anger. For him, "real anger" cannot be controlled. Thus, the contrast between these two thinkers is that for Aristotle anger is sometimes justified while for Seneca no true anger is ever justified. Seneca is one of my favorite thinkers, but in this particular instance, it seems that by introducing the subcategory of "true anger" his argument verges on the textbook example of the no true Scotsman fallacy.

In the penultimate chapter Pianalto discusses and responds to several objections to his arguments for patience as an important virtue in particular, and to virtue ethics in general. He demonstrates his familiarity with current research and debates in virtue ethics and moral psychology and answers the objections in a meticulous and balanced manner.

One objection is that good does not always come to those who wait (102). Pianalto counters the objection by noting that it rests on a misunderstanding of the nature of patience which "doesn't preclude active struggle" (103). According to him, a patient person is also a person of practical wisdom who does not indiscriminately exercise patience in all situations. Additionally, a patient person is a person of courage who will take decisive actions when it is deemed appropriate to do so. Pianalto makes it clear that patience is not an island unto itself, disconnected from other virtues such as practical wisdom, courage, love, justice, but rather is integral to a network of virtues that function in tandem in the service of moral ideals.

Pianalto then uses the example of a patient thief to illustrate another problem called "vicious patience." If a thief exhibits patience in executing his nefarious scheme, should we attribute the virtue of patience to him? After a lengthy, dialectical discussion, Pianalto argues that in order to be (called) a truly patient thief, the thief in question has to show some amount of patience not only in how he executes his plan but also in the way he arrives at his decision to steal (108). This is of course a tall order for the thief as he can hardly pass the teleological test. Pianalto concludes by noting that he would side with Gregory in criticizing the thief as "there is a deeper sort of impatience at work" in his undertaking (108). It may be said that the thief is tactically patient but strategically impatient. This seems to be a reasonable compromise. But I think the deeper issue -- whether virtues like patience are morally neutral -- remains. It seems to me that patience is different from typical moral virtues such as justice, truth-telling or kindness and it is independent of moral ascriptions. Scientific discoveries and inventions require patience. Newton, for instance, attributed his scientific achievements more to "patient attention" than to any talent. Robinson Crusoe is very patient in his struggle to survive but his patience is unconnected with social virtues because he (thinks he) lives alone. And even wild animals can be said to be patient -- lions exhibit enormous patience in stalking their prey, but we rarely attribute to them kindness, justice or other moral virtues.

Pianalto refers to the last objection as "fragmented patience." It is called "fragmented" because according to some critics, virtues in general and patience in particular are situation- or domain-specific and will not necessarily generalize to other situations and domains (120). This objection draws on the studies in social psychology that seem to contradict what is called the "globalist notion of character" (119), which is the idea that actions can be accurately explained by the character traits of the agent. The empirical findings have indicated that situational factors rather than character traits may play a greater role in our actions. If so, when we assign blame or praise to an agent's character traits, we may commit what social psychologists refer to as the "Fundamental Attribution Error" (FAE), jargon Pianalto does not use. He counters the objection by arguing that while ideals of global virtue may be psychologically unrealistic, they can still be used as standards in relation to which we attribute virtues to agents in degrees (121).

In the final chapter, Pianalto discusses some quantitative issues with regard to patience. How long should we exercise patience? Is there a limit to it? If the exercise of patience has a teleological dimension or a reference point (i.e., a worthy goal or a long term plan), what if it becomes evident to us that the goal we are pursuing is hopelessly unattainable? What if one is terminally ill and in excruciating agony? Should she continue to be patient? Pianalto states poetically that "there is a kind of patience that endures -- that can endure -- even if our particular faith is shaken or our hopes are dashed" (134). This is to take patience as constitutively valuable. But I am of the opinion that virtues derive their worth from their telos. They are valuable because they are instrumental to living a good life construed not primarily individualistically. If so, then perhaps they should not be insisted upon at all costs. Even life itself should not be clung to unconditionally. In some dire situations where one must choose the lesser of two evils, it should not be determined a priori that the lesser is always to endure pointless suffering.

In the Preface, Pianalto states, "Although I was surprised to find that relatively little had been written by contemporary philosophers, further searching led me to an eclectic range of writings spanning several different philosophical and religious traditions" (xi). By "several different philosophical and religious traditions", he means Western philosophical, Christian, Islamic, and Buddhist traditions. Throughout the book, however, there is not a single reference to the only tradition that produced two classics entirely dedicated to the virtue of patience, broadly construed -- the Chinese tradition. But this is not an oversight on Pianalto's part since to my knowledge they have not been translated into English, but rather a reminder that there is a substantial gap to be filled in cross-cultural philosophical studies with regard to the virtue of patience.

By taking the road less travelled, Pianalto has done a great service to virtue ethics by reclaiming the long-neglected virtue of patience. His excellent book has thrust the virtue of patience to the foreground of the contemporary revival of virtue ethics, and will spark widespread philosophical interest in examining the nature of patience and its intricate relationship with other virtues that have long enjoyed the spotlight.