On Philosophy: Notes from a Crisis

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John McCumber, On Philosophy: Notes from a Crisis, Stanford University Press, 2013, 288pp., $25.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780804781435.

Reviewed by Wendy C. Hamblet, North Carolina A&T State University


Prolific philosopher John McCumber gives us a new treat and a new angle for reconsidering the history of philosophy in this book.  He opens with Cohen and Dascal's lament (1989) that a crisis has arisen in philosophy as "dissidents question the accepted standards on all fronts" and then sets out to unpack the aspects of the crisis that philosophy currently faces and to identify the main challenges that constitute the crisis. McCumber points to two main challenges that have shaken the discipline in the past thirty years.  The first, the global rise of "postmodernity", has uprooted the meanings and usefulness of normative terms, such as truth, reason, freedom, progress, and many others.  The second, the "pluralist revolt" (at least among American philosophers, voiced at APA meetings), has challenged the way that leading philosophy departments distribute leadership roles, many philosophers perceiving themselves to be professionally judged, not on their philosophical merits, but on their categorization in philosophical groupings (e.g., phenomenologists, pragmatists, Catholics). McCumber adds a third dimension to the crisis, a longstanding challenge to philosophy: philosophy suffers, as do all Humanities disciplines, from a devaluation of their work in the estimation of a science-fascinated world.

The crisis facing philosophy in the third millennium takes a trifold form, according to McCumber, in the senses encoded in the etymological root of the word for crisis, krinein (ancient Greek, meaning "to separate" or "to divide"). The crisis has effected a trifold separation or division among today's philosophers. First, there is the timeworn separation of philosophers from the wider culture, effected by the meta-nature of their deliberations. Next, there is a separation from each other, both at the macro-level in the split between philosophers of the analytic tradition and those of the continental tradition, and at the micro-level as the drive toward specialization bleeds from scientific realms of inquiry into philosophy, shattering the once holistic "quest for truth" into nearly countless microspecialities, whose specialists barely speak to each other. Finally, there is the split that alienates philosophers from philosophy itself, as internal and external alienations drive philosophers to populate their philosophy departments only with philosophers who share their micro-allegiances, and to dismiss refreshing new voices and arenas of thinking that might give new life to their discipline.

McCumber demonstrates the first separation by lamenting Eric Weilenberg's (2006) description of philosophy's task as "find[ing] a question or puzzle that interests me, try[ing] to figure out a solution . . . and see[ing] if anyone is interested in publishing it" (4). If this is what philosophers do, McCumber remarks, it is a great wonder that philosophers receive any respect at all. Philosophers, he argues, should be required to become involved in more important things than what titillates their passing fancy, given the great monetary, political, and moral crises tearing apart the post-9/11 world outside their departmental doors. Next, McCumber draws from Scott Soames' (2003) criticism that philosophers have become specialized in their narrow research niches to the point where they can no longer work with each other. They systematically dismiss the work of any thinker outside their own narrow microspecialty, to the point that many philosophy departments today, where they have managed to survive the chronic funding cuts that threaten all departments in the Humanities, are more like narrow cliques of like-minded thinkers who hire only their pals. Quoting Zurich philosopher Hans-Johann Glock, McCumber then demonstrates the third separation: despite many new and exciting ideas from thinkers around the globe and promising new programs in philosophy, such as experimental philosophy and speculative realism, leading philosophers in major philosophy departments do not care about good work being done in their disciplines outside their own narrow (Anglophone) micro-milieu. The third split is best exemplified in the ludicrous Open Letter of 1992 by nineteen philosophers, protesting Cambridge University's plan to award an honorary degree to one of the most influential thinkers of the past century, Jacques Derrida.

McCumber summarizes: "to many philosophers, what makes a problem philosophically important is that it is interesting (Weilenberg) to a small group of people (Soames) who are linked, not by the quality of their work (Glock), but by their employment in major departments of philosophy (Open Letter)" (7). Its widening separations threaten the very existence of philosophy, warns McCumber, but neither the APA nor SPEP  have followed the examples of other disciplinary groups, such as the Modern Language Association (MLA) or the American Political Science Association (APSA), in allocating serious resources to foster informed reflection on the problematic state of their discipline. They have barely raised the questions of philosophy's future or where it ought to go from the current impasses. Even at this critical time of increasing financial cutbacks and philosophy department closings at major institutions, philosophy simply soldiers on without focused self-examination and without basic change beyond the ever-widening alienation gaps.

This lack of critical self-reflection among philosophers is shocking, given that self-examination composes the very trademark conceptual movement of the discipline. It is also scandalous because crises in the world at large (terrorism, war, poverty, global plutocracy, neocolonialism) offend philosophy's traditional understanding of its task as the critical examination of basic values and beliefs. In times of crisis, the least prepared layperson tends to engage in critical self-reflection, but professional philosophical critical reflection is lacking just when it is most needed. Philosophers can no longer afford the luxury of their traditional state of isolation, affirms McCumber. Many aspects of Western culture that terrorists abhor (political and sexual freedom, modern versions of Christianity and Judaism, Middle East policy, science, capitalism) require critical philosophical analysis, and many of the problems that plague the world today have their roots in the ideas of canonical philosophers. Today's most pressing crises are crises of ideas before they are expressed in suicide bombs and guerrilla attacks. Enemies come to resemble each other, explains McCumber. Fundamentalist zeal, rage at secularity, religious intolerance, fear of modernity -- these are features that average Americans tend to share with the radical Muslim world! We are left with a world where torturers torture each other, where gods are pitted against each other, where no-holds-barred terror tactics (suicide bombers and drone warfare) are practiced on all sides, and where civil rights are under siege across the ideological divide. These phenomena demand critical analysis by philosopher and layperson alike.

If philosophers restrict their vision to the day-to-day activities of philosophers in their departments or microfields they won't see the raging forest fires for the monotony of the "interesting" trees standing around them. If they look a little farther, however, glaring signs of disaster indicate that philosophy has lost its way and is no longer engaged in the important task that Socrates set before his interlocutors: discussing the "right conduct of life" and how to help citizens do good. As McCumber sees the problem, those microfields of philosophy are not separate components of some larger worthwhile enterprise but are merely "interesting arguments" adrift on separate intellectual seas. He urges philosophers to look beyond their narrow interests to recognize the looming threats to philosophy in particular and to "the Enlightenment values to which philosophy has long been committed" (10).

I must admit that I shuddered when first I read his warning. Many philosophers (at least those of us schooled in the Continental tradition) would argue that the only truly grounded, ethically-engaged, worthwhile philosophy of the past half century has arisen from a rejection of Enlightenment values. However, McCumber goes on to explain that to defend philosophy against current threats requires that philosophers first turn upon the Enlightenment. He then considers the pivotal text that expresses Enlightenment values, Kant's 1784 essay, "What is Enlightenment?" to discover where Enlightenment values went astray.

Central to understanding the problem, McCumber discovers, is Kant's opening distinction that we do not live in an "Enlightened Age" but in an ongoing "Age of Enlightenment." The revolutionary force, time, becomes part of the discussion, rendering enlightenment a "process." In this process, the principle of human equality is betrayed, since time and process permit some (Anglo-Saxon males) a prior place in the unfolding chronology of enlightenment, while others (e.g., women and people of color) lag far behind in their progress toward that lofty goal. The introduction of timely process permits Kant to exclude the entire "fair sex" and other races from the agora of communal discourse that constitutes the process of enlightenment. Thus, Kant's effort to validate the value of human equality backfires from the opening lines of this essay, and instead the pivotal philosophical text lays the conceptual groundwork of a general theory of inequality that supplies justification for oppression of the "less enlightened" peoples of the earth. This constitutes what McCumber calls the "paradox of the Enlightenment." He states: "the history of philosophy is no benign storeroom of ideas. It is a booby-trapped labyrinth where the best-lit hallways are often dead ends and the real passageways are often hidden" (65).

Having exposed the roots of inequality and oppression at the heart of Enlightenment philosophy, McCumber proceeds to demonstrate how the trifold crisis in philosophy today rests in contemporary philosophers' narrow adherence to ideals and conceptual traditions of concealed cruelty and to rules of logic and strict definitions of reason, truth, and other key concepts. Some gentler, wiser ideas, such as the "malleable" reason of Hegel or the "fragile" reason of Heidegger, and their notions of "reconciliation" and "letting be," offer alternative metaphors for recovering and transcending a history of philosophy, grounded in oppressive ontology, that all too often plays out in social and political history on the wrong side of ethics.

However, there is hope on the philosophical horizon, if we are willing to embrace alternatives to the canon. Enlightenment values, offers McCumber, may be reshaped into critical practices more adequate to the needs of our times. New knowledges are arising all the while from women and people of color around the globe. These voices constitute what McCumber names "the speaking of matter" (public language), previously silenced by the metaphysics that excluded them as unreasonable, unenlightened. If these new works are embraced and not ghettoized, they constitute the hope of philosophy's future. McCumber then constructs a framework of ways in which matter might speak outside the tradition's rules, logic, and narrow definitions of value and truth. If philosophy can more amenably listen and incorporate these messages into its own procedures, they may provide the "real passageways" that grant philosophy a future worth pursuing.

On Philosophy is a valuable study that will stop in their dedicated, narrow-minded tracks philosophers from both the analytical and the continental traditions that have increasingly painted themselves into corners where they discourse alone with their pals. McCumber joins a new tradition in writing as one of the radical new messengers that challenge the "benign" history of thought. He joins a long intellectual line of "philosophical savages" such as Derrida and other "postmoderns" whose messages have been relentless over these many decades since the Holocaust awakened their philosophical consciences to the metaphysical resonances between the logic of Being and the logic of oppression (ontology and tyranny). In concert, these broader thinkers remind philosophers that much in their canon needs to be rethought, solicited (shaken), and duly mourned. The best philosophers have always remained faithful to the Socratic quest for "right conduct of life" and passionately engaged with the problems of their world. McCumber is clearly one of those "best philosophers."


Cohen, Avner, and Marcelo Dascal (eds.). 1989. The Institution of Philosophy: A Discipline in Crisis? La Salle, IL: Open Court.

Glock, Hans-Johann. 2008. What is Analytical Philosophy? Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Soames, Scott. 2003. Philosophical Analysis in the Twentieth Century, 2 vols. Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press.

Weilenberg, Eric. 2006. "My Turn: I Think; Therefore I Am." Newsweek, October 16.